Ethics After Aristotle

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Brad Inwood, Ethics After Aristotle, Harvard University Press, 2014, 166pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674731257.

Reviewed by Christopher Gill, University of Exeter


This short but illuminating book opens the door on a little-known strand in Greek and Roman philosophy, Aristotelian ethics between Aristotle's successor, Theophrastus (late fourth century BC) and the great Aristotelian commentator, Alexander of Aphrodisias (second/third century AD). The evidence for this topic is either indirect (especially in the Hellenistic period) or based on sources that raise difficult exegetical as well as interpretative questions. Recent scholarly work has gone some way to making this material more widely available, notably in Robert Sharples' 2010 translation of sources for Peripatetic philosophy (200 BC-200 AD) and the essays on Peripatetic thought in the 2007 two-volume survey of ancient philosophy (100 BC-200 AD) edited by Sharples and Richard Sorabji.

Brad Inwood's book, based on a lecture-series given at Harvard, is focused solely on ethics and is more conceptually ambitious than earlier studies. He aims not simply to report and explain the evidence but to try to make philosophical sense of key themes and cross-currents in Aristotelian ethics in this period. This is partly a matter of reconstructing how Peripatetic thinkers responded to salient innovations (after Aristotle) by other schools, especially in Stoicism but also, as Inwood reminds us, in Epicureanism. More crucially, it is a matter of tracking what Peripatetic thinkers saw as distinctively Aristotelian in their intellectual inheritance and how they restated this in the light of subsequent developments. Inwood places special emphasis on Aristotelian naturalism, especially but not only, as expressed in the famous human function argument of Nicomachean Ethics 1.7. He thinks that Aristotle´s distinctive move of locating ethics (including questions of agency, pleasure, virtue and happiness) against a broad conception of human nature underpins a number of (relatively) new features in Peripatetic thought in this period, especially in Antiochus, Arius Didymus and Alexander. He also suggests that this dimension of Aristotelian thought has the potential to make a significant contribution to modern ethics, now that Aristotle's thinking on virtue and happiness has already been absorbed by contemporary virtue-ethics. The latter proposal is made most explicitly in the first chapter, ("Working in the Wake of Genius"), which includes a thoughtful review of the post-war reception of the Aristotelian approach and which notes some attempts (e.g., by Philippa Foot and John McDowell) to engage with Aristotelian naturalism (pp. 7, 13). But it also underpins his reading of Peripatetic thought throughout the book, which seems designed to render this dimension of the Aristotelian tradition accessible to readers whose philosophical interests go well beyond those of specialists of ancient thought.

In his treatment of specific Peripatetic thinkers, Inwood isolates a limited number of salient motifs and aims to make sense of them within their intellectual context. His brief comments on Theophrastus identify an apparent tendency to adopt clear-cut positions (for instance on the contribution of external circumstances to happiness) where Aristotle´s treatment was dialectical and nuanced. He sees the Magna Moralia (MM) (a work attributed to Aristotle but now widely seen as by a later Peripatetic thinker) as also inclined to stress more than Aristotle the role of external factors. A related strand in this work is a practical and emotion-focused tendency, which comes out in the definition of the virtues as mean states of emotions (coupled with criticism of Socratic intellectualism), and a stress on the importance of practical rather than contemplative wisdom. Inwood also finds in MM, and in some lesser-known third-century Peripatetics (Lycon and Hieronymus) a more positive view of pleasure than is generally associated with the Aristotelian school. The MM saw "every pleasure as a good," Lycon defined happiness as "true joy of the soul . . . at fine things," and Hieronymus defined happiness as a life free from disturbance (pp. 33, 39, 42). A common thread here is a version of hedonism (chapter 2 is called "Flirting with Hedonism (It´s Only Natural)"). Inwood finds here a possible response to Epicureanism and also an expression of the relatively positive (though not always consistent) account of pleasure given by Aristotle himself. He points out that during the third century BC, Epicureanism was still a major philosophical influence on other schools and that the tendency of Peripatetics, along with Academics and Stoics, to exclude the school from serious consideration belongs to a later period (first century BC onwards).

In chapter 3 ("The Turning Point: From Critolaus to Cicero"), Inwood focuses on two major figures, Critolaus, the mid second-century head of the school, and Antiochus (first century BC), an Academic strongly influenced by Peripatetic ideas. In both cases, he sees a response to the powerful critique of contemporary (especially Stoic) ethics by the second-century Academic Sceptic, Carneades. This led Critolaus to offer as a formalised doctrine the Aristotelian suggestion that there are three kinds of good (psychological, bodily and external), and to define happiness as a life that is completely "filled out" by these goods (pp. 54-5), thus taking again a Theophrastean line on the contribution of external goods to happiness. As Inwood points out, Critolaus, perhaps influenced by Carneades' way of classifying goods, set aside Aristotle's presentation of happiness as an activity of soul in accordance with virtue (NE 1.7). The version of Academic/Peripatetic ethics offered in Cicero, On Ends Book 5 (normally seen as that of Antiochus, though Inwood has doubts about this, pp. 71-2) reflects the influence of Critolaus alongside Stoicism. The account is cast in Stoic mode as a version of human ethical development conceived as "appropriation" or "familiarisation" (oikeiosis), and it adopts the hard Stoic view that virtue is sufficient for happiness. This account also re-introduces the Aristotelian stress on the idea of happiness as activity in accordance with virtue, while retaining a version of Critolaus' view about the value of external goods in the form of the idea that bodily and external goods are necessary for complete happiness. Thus, Inwood shows how some of the most creative moves in the Peripatetic tradition in this period constitute responses to ethical debate within and outside the school.

In chapter 4, ("Bridging the Gap: Aristotelian Ethics in the Early Roman Empire"), there are again two main topics. One is the account of development as oikeiosis that forms part of a handbook-style summary of Peripatetic ethics ("Doxography C"), normally attributed to the Augustan thinker Arius Didymus. Inwood sees here, as in the account in Cicero, On Ends 5, a version of the Aristotelian naturalistic approach to ethics, which presents ethical development as the realisation of our nature as human agents. The treatment has absorbed a Stoic framework and terminology without losing its distinctive Aristotelian standpoint, and, by contrast with Stoicism, gives scope for goods other than virtue as parts of happiness. The second topic is the debate between Stoic and Peripatetic ideas on emotion, which is presented from a pro-Stoic perspective in Cicero, Tusculan Disputations 4 and Seneca, On Anger. As Inwood points out, this debate shows how Peripatetic thinkers could move well beyond Aristotle himself, in formulating the idea that anger is needed to provide the motivational basis for courage and self-defence, an idea that embodies a kind of natural teleological approach. Cicero brings out this dimension more clearly than Seneca, which may mean they were responding to different versions of the theory, though the evidence does not allow us to say who exactly these Peripatetic thinkers were.

In his final chapter ("Alexander and Imperial Aristotelianism"), Inwood focuses on discussions in which Alexander of Aphrodisias, the great Aristotelian commentator, also brings out the naturalistic dimension of Aristotelian ethics in his treatment of oikeiosis. He discusses a short treatment in the Ethical Problems, and then a rather longer account in the Mantissa. The second account (for which Inwood provides his own translation) reviews earlier Peripatetic treatments before offering Alexander's own view. In an economical and elegant treatment, Alexander does justice to the idea that human beings have a primary orientation (to oneself) but also an inbuilt drive to realise our fully developed nature as rational agents. He also presents this realisation as inherently pleasurable without making pleasure the goal of life. Thus, for Inwood, Alexander's treatment, which is presented by the commentator as bringing out Aristotle´s own approach (as distinct from that of later Peripatetics) expresses clearly the ethical naturalism which is typical of the whole tradition.

What are the main merits of this book? Despite the relative shortness of the work and the explicit attempt at an overview, Inwood's account is innovative both in the readings of specific thinkers and in the overall characterisation of what is distinctive in the Aristotelian tradition in this period, which underlines the strongly naturalist dimension, while not neglecting other intellectual trends. The presentation is lucid and engaging, with all texts presented in translation, and Inwood's treatment is accessible to a wide range of readers including those working primarily on modern ethics. Although more specialist readers will pick up a number of interesting suggestions about the character and provenance of the ideas he discusses (including Cicero's account of Stoic oikeiosis and the source of De Finibus 5, pp. 66-7, 71-2), these do not obtrude unduly on the overall exposition. In so far as the book has limitations, these derive from its character as a reflective overview based on a lecture-series. Inwood's core claims about the distinctive Aristotelian stance of ethical naturalism merit a fuller and more explicitly argued treatment, and one which defines this naturalism by contrast with (for instance) Stoic and Epicurean versions of ethical naturalism. This would be needed before we could be confident that it is Aristotle's version of this theme that has most to contribute to contemporary debate in ethical philosophy, both within and outside contemporary virtue-ethics. Several of the more specialised points made or indicated about the evidence or ideas of the Aristotelian tradition also deserve fuller discussion, and are likely to receive this in other contexts. Overall, for anyone looking for a helpful guide to this strand in ancient philosophy and for philosophical reasons why we should want to explore this strand, Inwood's book offers an excellent resource.