Ethics and Animals: An Introduction

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Lori Gruen, Ethics and Animals: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 250pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521717731.

Reviewed by Julia Driver, Washington University in St. Louis


Lori Gruen has been writing about animals and ethics for a number of years, and her expertise is apparent in her new book, Ethics and Animals: an Introduction. The book is written as an introduction to ethical issues surrounding animals and our treatment of them. It is definitely written from the point of view of someone who values and respects animals. Gruen is upfront about that in her introduction.

She begins the book by providing a critique of 'human exceptionalism,' that is, the view that human beings are somehow special in morally relevant ways. Of course, humans are different from animals in some ways -- though this may be a matter of degree rather than kind for some of our capacities, relative to some animals like the Great Apes. The interesting issue, though, is -- are any of those purported differences morally relevant or morally relevant to the degree that would justify our current practices with respect to animals? As she argues, there really aren't any. Animals are sentient; they are creatures with lives that can go better or worse for them. This is a morally relevant consideration, surely. Animals may not be rational, or fully rational, they cannot articulate demands, and so forth -- but then this is true of some humans as well.

Peter Singer was one of the first philosophers to popularize this sort of argument in favor of the moral considerability of animals in the popular culture. It is a powerful argument. Forms of it are generally referred to as the 'Argument from Marginal Cases' or AMC for short, since the argument appeals to the fact that there are 'marginal cases' of humans who are not persons because they lack the requisite capacities. And yet we believe they have moral standing. Towards the end of chapter 2, Gruen engages in a careful and sensitive rebuttal of those who criticize AMC on the grounds that it is offensive and hurtful. The AMC holds that, basically, as there is no morally relevant difference between many animals and some human beings who are severely cognitively impaired -- and, indeed, many animals may possess superior capacities to some humans who are severely cognitively impaired -- we have either to change our practices towards animals, and regard them as having moral standing, or change our practices to those who are cognitively impaired. Of course, the vast majority of people will opt for continuing to maintain a commitment to the care of those human beings who are cognitively impaired. This seems to require that we recognize that animals ought not be abused, used, and mistreated.

 Some writers reject the argument, and they do so on two fronts: humans who are cognitively impaired are parts of a social framework that confers rights on them; animals are not. Further, it is just offensive to compare a human being to an animal. This is a touchy subject because strong feelings are at stake. But Gruen handles it delicately, arguing that social imbeddedness seems irrelevant to moral standing in that it seems odd to hold that a human who lacks such social relations lacks those rights (imagine a baby that has been abandoned, for example). Also, animals are part of the social structure as well. Much has been written recently on companion animals, for example, who are often taken as 'part of the family.' It is also insufficient to argue against a view by simply pointing out that one finds it offensive. If that were enough to stop an argument there would have been little in the way of moral progress. She also points out that such criticism isn't fair to those who use the AMC: typically, they simply want to expand the moral community, not contract it -- not exclude moral patients.

One very common argument against affording animals any moral standing is the argument from 'nature.' Animals eat each other, so it is okay for us to eat them. It is natural behavior. We evolved to eat animals, so it is okay. Basically, the argument is presented as a variation on this theme. Gruen also takes up this issue in the second chapter of her book. She does an excellent job of considering versions of the view that the 'natural is normative'. As David Hume noted, 'natural' can have a lot of meanings. If, for example, it is opposed to 'culture' then the above-mentioned challenge doesn't make sense. Human beings interact with animals within a cultural context. If it refers to the fact that human beings evolved to treat animals badly, and eat meat, and so forth, it is clearly not normative. We evolved all sorts of nasty dispositions.

In addition to making a strong case for the moral considerability of animals in the first portion of the book, Gruen also provides a good deal of background on animal issues throughout the book. She describes the development of factory farming, animal experimentation, and the use of zoos. She discusses animal captivity, and how to understand the notion of 'animal dignity' in captivity, as opposed to the wild. She often frames the issues in terms of stories about actual animals. For example, she tells the story of Milla, a young chimp who was found as a baby in a bush meat market in Cameroon, still chained to her dead mother. As a youngster she lived with a couple who treated her as a human child, but eventually ended up as a kind of pet, or attraction, at a hotel. She was discovered and rescued by Jane Goodall, who took her to a chimpanzee sanctuary in Zambia. She was fortunate in this respect. This case is used to help illustrate the plight of wild animals, such as chimpanzees, who must cope with shrinking natural habitat. Some have argued that ecotourism is a win-win solution to this problem -- conflicts for resources between animals and human beings can be handled by making the animals in their natural habitat a tourist attraction, which can provide jobs and resources to local populations. Gruen goes over the pitfalls of ecotourism, though she notes that ecotourism has helped to reduce conflicts between animal populations and humans.

One feature of the book that I find very helpful is its clear-eyed take on the 'holistic' approach to environmental ethics that dominates the pop culture understanding of environmental ethics. Gruen does a really nice job of pointing out the problems with J. Baird Callicott's view that we ought to be focused on "preserving and protecting 'the integrity, stability, and beauty' of an ecological community" (171) There are profound issues of vagueness, for one thing, in this simple prescription. Gruen also points out that such a commitment would mean always opting for preserving an ecosystem, even if that meant wiping out entire species. The problem is that holists have bought into a false dichotomy with respect to how we can value nature; either instrumentally, or intrinsically. But of course, these are not mutually exclusive and, further still, there are a variety of ways one can value intrinsically and a variety of things one can value instrumentally.

One thing I would have liked to have seen is an extended discussion of the issue of hunting for sport, or killing animals for fun. There are large numbers of people who still believe that hunting animals for fun is not only permissible, but also actually virtuous. Indeed, there are some who appeal to a kind of ethics of nature to justify it. One writer in the New York Times put it this way:

For hunters like me, hunting isn't ultimately about the gun. It's about wildlife and the land that sustains it . . . I decided to learn to hunt because I wanted to read landscapes and understand their secrets, too. I wanted to learn more about where my food comes from. To hunt is to become fluent enough in an ecosystem not only to watch but also to participate in it." (Lily Raff McCaulou, "I Hunt, but the N. R. A. Isn't for Me," April 24, 2012).

This always struck me as a strange kind of reason to kill something, but apparently there are many people who kill and also feel good about themselves for doing it.

There really is not much to criticize in this book. It is both good-hearted and well-argued. I encourage anyone interested in animal ethics to read it, and learn.