Ethics and Chronic Illness

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Tom Walker, Ethics and Chronic Illness, Routledge, 2019, 242pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367210205.

Reviewed by Rebecca Chan and Jordan Liz, San José State University


Unlike other medical conditions, chronic illness is not curable. Successful treatment aims to either prevent future complications arising from one's condition and/or help the patient manage it. The goal is to enable the patient to live as comfortably as possible with her condition. For Tom Walker, these distinctive features of chronic illness mean that questions regarding what it means to benefit the patient, or what the role of prevention in clinical ethics will be, are importantly different from cases of acute conditions. Yet, despite this, ethical reflection on chronic illnesses has been largely omitted within the field of medical ethics.

In his book, Walker sets out to fill this gap in the literature. The first five chapters are dedicated to gaining conceptual clarity on a number of key concepts in medical ethics, such as informed consent, beneficence, nonmaleficence and autonomy. While Walker discusses chronic illnesses, his aim in these chapters is to ensure "that the account being developed was defensible across the board -- what is needed for consent in the treatment of chronic illness, for example, must be in line with what is needed for consent in other areas of healthcare" (129). Chapters 6 through 8 focus on issues that Walker views as more specific to chronic illness: the problem of non-adherence, the role of friends and family in managing chronic illnesses, and how the responsibilities of caregivers will change over time.

If readers are hoping to discover the ways in which chronic illnesses present unique ethical challenges, they may be disappointed. While the three issues above perhaps arise more often in cases of chronic illness, they are not unique to them. Now, to be clear, that Walker's arguments apply to both chronic and non-chronic illness is not necessarily problematic -- arguably, it is a strength of the book. However, it would be a mistake to walk away thinking that Walker has demonstrated that there is a difference in kind between chronic and non-chronic illnesses. We dedicate the rest of this review to each of the three issues purportedly unique to chronic illness, and discuss ways in which they do (and do not) shed light on the ethical concerns surrounding chronic illness.

In Chapter 6, Walker asks what doctors ought to do in cases of non-adherence. For instance, one might wonder to what extent doctors ought to intervene in order to encourage patients to adhere to their treatment plans. There are two standard objections to intervention on the part of doctors. First, such interventions might be overly paternalistic. Second, one might think that once the treatment plan is established, responsibility for executing the plan belongs to the patient. In addition, one might be tempted to think that whether these two objections are successful depends on whether the non-adherence is intentional. But, according to Walker, another cross-cutting factor deserves attention: whether the patient is able to adhere. Mixed into adherence is a discussion of how doctors and patients are participating in a shared activity, albeit one in which patients (but not doctors) are free to leave. Ultimately, it turns out that the cases in which doctor intervention is worrisome are those where non-adherence results from intentional action on the part of patients in situations in which they could adhere if they wanted.

Based on what Walker says, the problem of non-adherence is not special to cases of chronic illness. For instance, it is fairly common for people to stop taking their prescription antibiotics once their symptoms disappear despite instructions to the contrary from their doctors and pharmacists. However, this chapter does raise a pair of issues that are more likely to arise in the case of chronic illness, and those may deserve further attention. First, in countries without universal healthcare such as the United States, patients without insurance are often unable to pay for prescription medication. For instance, diabetics who cannot afford enough insulin may resort to "rationing" what insulin they can obtain. This is a situation in which patients are unable to adhere due to social circumstances. While doctor intervention might not be ethically worrisome in this case, it may be that intervention might be pragmatically worrisome since doctors are not well-situated when it comes to addressing structural societal problems. Second, Walker mentions the case of mental illness, which can often be chronic (e.g., depression or schizophrenia). In this category of cases (we might also include addiction in it), the line between ability and inability to adhere to treatment is blurred because the nature of the illness is such that there are epistemic difficulties for both the patient and the outside observer in telling whether the patient is unable to adhere because of the illness, or able to adhere and freely choosing not to.

These two types of cases highlight an additional level of complexity deserving more attention when it comes to how doctors ought to respond to non-adherence. Ideally, doctors can look at readily available facts about whether patients are able to adhere and then whether they intentionally don't. But the real world often falls short of the ideal. Sometimes patients are unable to adhere due to structural shortcomings of the medical system in which doctors are embedded. Other times, the nature of the illness obscures whether the non-adherence falls into Walker's categories. This highlights the need for a non-ideal theory that parallels non-ideal theory in political philosophy.

Chapters 7 deals with the role of patients, family and others in helping those with chronic illness manage their condition. In particular, the chapter focuses on two ethical challenges: first, do physicians have a responsibility to disclose confidential medical information to friends and family that are involved in caring for their patient, and secondly, how should a physician respond if a friend or family member, who has previously agreed to help the patient, abnegates on their responsibility? In reply to the first, Walker argues although sharing medical records may involving breaching confidentiality, it may still be morally permissible if doing so will benefit the patient. Beyond issues of confidentiality and privacy, disclosing medical information to third parties may be morally wrong because it will harm the patient (e.g., lead to discrimination by employers, higher premiums by insurance companies). In limited cases, in which the medical provider has reason to believe that sharing information will benefit the patient, it may be morally permissible. With regard to the second ethical challenge, Walker argues that  medical provides may be justified in intervening so long as they have consulted with their patient and considered their input.

Like much of the book, this chapter leaves the reader wanting. While the incurability of chronic illness means that such ethical challenges are more likely to present themselves, they are not fundamentally distinct from challenges that may occur in non-chronic cases. The person with a broken an arm, for example, may greatly require the assistance of others. Tasks that she ordinarily may have been able to do herself (e.g., drive, carry groceries, bathe) now become daunting. Such challenges may even persist after the cast has been removed, as the muscle regains strength. In this case, informing the patient's friends and families (or caregivers more generally) of her condition and any possible long-term effects may be very beneficial in helping her recover. Even more short-term conditions, such as the common cold, a sore throat, or suffering a deep cut requiring stitches may make one more dependent on others for a short period of time. In these instances, it seems that medical providers may have the same ethical obligation to share information with friends and family.

As for the second issue, here too, while the problem may occur more frequently in cases of chronic illness, such a challenge may present itself regardless of the length of the condition. If I suffer a back injury from exercising, and my friends and family fail to assist me, I may likewise seek counsel from my physician and ask her to intervene. That said, such a situation is only likely to occur in instances in which the patient has a long-term relationship with her medical provider. After all, it is one thing to disclose personal information about the nature of your condition (e.g., how it impacts your everyday life, what you do to manage it), and another entirely to complain to your physician about your unhelpful friends or family.

While Walker's point may be that such long-term relationships are more likely to arise in treating chronic illnesses, that still presupposes long-term continuity of care. What exactly would such intervention consist of? Contacting the patient's friends and family and asking them to help? Telling them why their help is necessary? Presumably if they already know about the patient's conditions, and even previously agreed to help, then they understand the medical needs of the patient. The source of their non-helpfulness, then, is likely to be more personal, and therefore involve a kind of intervention that a medical provider will be unlikely to provide. Now, the question of effectiveness and ethics are distinct. Walker may still argue that, even if ineffective, your physician may still have an ethical obligation to intervene. However, perhaps a better argument is that in such instances medical providers should, or even ought to, put patients in contact with trained counselors, and perhaps even participate in counseling sessions. Either way, while it is questionable what exactly is to be gained from such an intervention, similar situations may arise during the treatment of non-chronic illnesses.

Finally, in Chapter 8, Walker considers how what doctors ought to do might change as the patient's situation changes. He considers three types of changes: changes to what treatments are available, changes to the patient or the patient's environment (e.g., the condition worsening or the support network failing), and changes initiated by the patient (e.g., newfound alcoholism or baby). Again, these types of changes are not unique to chronic illness. For instance, a cancer patient might discover that she is pregnant, and her preferences for treatments may change in light of the fact that some treatments will affect the viability of the pregnancy. But, they are far more likely to arise in the case of chronic illnesses than in non-chronic illness in virtue of the fact that chronic illnesses are more likely to extend across longer periods of time than non-chronic illnesses.

Readers may find that this chapter, in particular, subverts their expectations. Changes to patient preferences and identities are a notable omission in the list of changes Walker considers. Dementia and Alzheimer's are chronic conditions. Frequently, patients undergo radical changes to their memory, sense of self, and preferences. For instance, in the early stage of Alzheimer's a patient may sign a DNR because she don't think that life in late stage Alzheimer's is worth living. However, the patient in the later stage may feel differently about quality of life.

Changes to preferences and identity also arise in cases near the border of illness and disability. Neither illness nor disability are well-defined, and we don't want to suggest that illness and disability are the same. However, cases that straddle the border of the two provide an additional layer of complexity to what doctors ought to do because people with disabilities often value the way in which their disabilities shape their identities. For instance, it's pretty plausible that being deaf is not intrinsically worse than being hearing. It's also pretty plausible that most people who are deaf value being deaf, and most people who are hearing value being hearing. This can also be an adaptive preference: people who become deaf may eventually come to value their deafness, and same for those who become hearing. Finally, it's pretty plausible that being part of the deaf or the hearing community shapes a person's sense of self. Given all of these factors, the cochlear implant itself might bring about significant changes to a patient's preferences, identity, and sense of self. Something similar might hold for other conditions such as vitiligo.

The two kinds of cases outlined above raise complex moral questions about what doctors ought to do in response to changes in preference and identity. One might have hoped they would be addressed in a book on chronic illness given that these cases make up a significant portion of chronic illnesses.

In conclusion, Walker has given us a thorough discussion of many ethical issues that apply especially, though not uniquely, to chronic illness.