Ethics and Criminal Justice: An Introduction

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John Kleinig, Ethics and Criminal Justice: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 283pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521682831.

Reviewed by Douglas Husak, Rutgers University


As the long-standing editor of Criminal Justice Ethics, John Kleinig is eminently qualified to write an introductory survey of the countless ethical problems that arise throughout the field of criminal justice. The result is an outstanding exploration of the tensions that arise between the demands of ordinary morality and the special duties that govern the behavior of various practitioners in criminal justice in virtue of their institutional roles.

An introductory book such as Ethics and Criminal Justice may have at least two objectives, and Kleinig succeeds at both. First, it may be adopted in survey courses. Undergraduates who choose to become police or corrections officers should be required to examine the ethical issues that pertain to their jobs. But the classes for which this book is appropriate are not merely those taken by students who contemplate a career in criminal justice. Philosophers of law who are interested in legal realities but frustrated by the content of typical jurisprudence courses -- the endless twists and turns in the ongoing debate between proponents of subtly distinct versions of positivism, for example -- should be encouraged to give careful consideration to Ethics and Criminal Justice. Our criminal justice system raises a host of important and complex moral problems that relatively few philosophers of law have pursued. This book offers an excellent opportunity to acquaint students in legal philosophy with many of these topics. This book also serves a second purpose. I recommend it to non-specialists who hope to be brought up to speed on a set of issues with which they are unfamiliar. Academics and non-academics alike can profit greatly by thinking about the myriad topics examined by Kleinig.

Only a careful and knowledgeable scholar like Kleinig could discuss these issues in a philosophically sophisticated manner. Insofar as most writers in criminal justice admit to having a normative theory at all, their preferred approach is consequentialist or utilitarian. Various proposals to organize or reorganize our institutions of criminal justice are evaluated by reference to whether their benefits exceed their costs. Kleinig's approach is far more nuanced and congenial to most of the moral philosophers who would consider adopting his book. Although he does not articulate a particular theory explicitly, he does not pretend that all interesting moral disputes should be resolved by a simple weighing of costs and benefits.

In my judgment, the single most important reason students fail to learn more philosophy in our classes is that they are unwilling or unable to read philosophical materials. Most of our assignments are probably too difficult for typical undergraduates. As a result, students despair and give up quickly. Ethics and Criminal Justice, however, is extraordinarily readable and jargon-free. Kleinig's style of writing is remarkably straightforward, even though he sacrifices no content in his presentation. He simplifies without oversimplifying.

An introductory text is somewhat more difficult to review in a forum such as Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews. Most philosophical reviews challenge the perceived weaknesses in the arguments authors provide. It is unfair, however, to subject introductions to the same kind of scrutiny. By his own admission, Kleinig is not trying to break new ground as much as to acquaint readers with issues that have received more detailed examination elsewhere. It is in the nature of such books that they stop their discussion just when matters become deep and interesting. Those who want more detail are guided to the "selected further reading" section at the end of the book. Since Ethics and Criminal Justice is so readable and sensible throughout, the main task of a critic of this introductory text is to decide whether Kleinig devotes too much or too little attention to given topics. On this score, I can find only a little fault. The book is divided into four self-contained parts: Criminalization, Policing, Courts, and Corrections. Each discussion is embellished with examples drawn from approximately fifty U.S. Supreme Court cases, examined in just the right amount of detail.

I commend the fact that Kleinig begins by devoting an entire part to the topic of criminalization. Sometimes scholars tend to take the content of the criminal law as given, with little attention to how it came to be as it is. Kleinig corrects this oversight, reminding us of the social and political forces that have shaped the criminal law today. In fact, however, the title of his first part is somewhat misleading. The main purpose of this part is to place the subsequent assessment of criminal justice institutions in a Lockean liberal framework that addresses the question of why we need government and law at all. Too much or too little of this theoretical background would mar the book; Kleinig provides exactly the appropriate balance.

The subsequent three parts are staples of criminal justice. The best chapter, in my judgment, involves the police. Kleinig persuasively argues that we should not think of the police primarily as enforcers of law, but rather as professionals whose primary obligation is as keepers of the peace. The increasing professionalism of police departments has been a welcome trend, transforming their role in a way that Kleinig usefully compares to that of nursing. He offers nice discussions of such topics as the use of deception in various stages of police work: investigation, interrogation, and in testifying -- the stage at which he is most critical of existing police practice.

Kleinig discusses issues typically given cursory attention in introductory texts. The chapter dealing with ethical questions surrounding prosecutors is as lengthy as that dealing with defense attorneys -- a welcome corrective to the overdone discussion of whether lawyers should represent clients they know to be guilty. The judiciary also receives thorough treatment. In the part of the book on corrections, the important topic of collateral consequences of conviction -- almost always neglected in a discussion of punishment -- is examined extensively. In many cases, these collateral consequences are more onerous than punishment itself. Students and non-specialists are likely to gain their first acquaintance with many of these issues by studying Kleinig's book.

Some parts and chapters are better than others. In my judgment, Kleinig's treatment of the jury is the weakest of the book. He devotes too much attention to the relatively unimportant issue of jury nullification and too little to questions that I believe to be more central. I was disappointed by his failure to discuss such topics as whether some legal controversies are too complex to be understood by typical jurors. Is a random sampling of citizens really able to decide whether accountants or engineers behaved reasonably in a corporate setting? Moreover, do jurors really pay much attention to the law? Lots of evidence indicates that distinct tests of legal insanity, for example, make almost no difference to the verdicts jurors reach when deciding whether a criminal defendant should be excused on grounds of insanity. Finally, can the jury survive at all in a society in which many citizens regard service as an intolerable burden? Since many citizens manage to shirk their duty, is the composition of juries truly representative of the community? These issues are not mentioned.

Kleinig has a great deal to say about the exercise of discretion and its compatibility with the rule of law. He usefully contrasts four contexts in which the need for discretion may arise: in determining the scope of authority, the interpretation of law, the priority to be given to scarce resources, and the tactics that are appropriate in given situations. Although this discussion is sophisticated, I am generally less sanguine about the verdict we should reach about discretionary power. The problem is not the possession of discretion per se -- it is largely unavoidable -- but rather with the way it is actually used. And how is it used? I would have appreciated more empirical evidence that reveals how discretion is exercised by police and prosecutors in real world situations. The fact that accurate data about such matters are scarce is itself a cause for alarm.

In addition, Kleinig might have devoted somewhat more attention to the various codes of professional responsibility that govern practitioners throughout the criminal justice system. Perhaps he neglects this topic because these codes are the focus of courses taught in the schools in which many of these practitioners are trained. Law students, for example, typically are required to complete a course in professional ethics -- a course that familiarizes them with the code or codes that impose duties and describe aspirations for their professional careers. For better or worse, Kleinig does little to duplicate the content of these required courses.

I was also surprised by the relative lack of attention to comparative law. Since Kleinig is a native Australian who spends half of his professional life in Canberra, one might have expected him to assess the strengths and weaknesses of criminal justice in the United States by drawing from the successes and failures of other countries. Although some comparative facts are presented -- the United States incarcerates far more citizens than other industrialized countries, for example -- Kleinig does not offer much insight into the systems of criminal justice in other countries. Of course, it is easy to find interesting topics that Kleinig did not mention. To his credit, the final product is a manageable 267 pages, and some debates simply had to be ignored.

Many fine introductions to criminal justice are available, but no competing book rivals Ethics and Criminal Justice in the depth of philosophical sophistication it devotes exclusively to the ethical issues that govern the behavior of criminal justice practitioners. Kleinig demonstrates what can happen when an excellent philosopher turns his attention to the real world of criminal justice. Although I have tried to raise a few quibbles, it is hard to see how a better introduction could have been written.