Ethics and Epics: Philosophy, Culture, and Religion

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Matilal, Bimal Krishna, Ethics and Epics: Philosophy, Culture, and Religion, ed. Jonardon Ganeri, Oxford University Press, 2002, 464pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN: 0195655117.

Reviewed by Nick Gier , University of Idaho


This book is the second volume of The Collected Essays of Bimal Krishna Matilal and both should be on the shelf of any serious student of Indian philosophy and religion. I was especially pleased to review this volume because, in my thirty years of teaching Indian philosophy, I focused far too much on metaphysics and epistemology and not enough on ethics. Working back from Gandhi’s ethics of nonviolence, I have been able to repair this deficiency somewhat, but Matilal has now helped me make a substantial improvement in my knowledge of Hindu ethics.

The ethics of the epics and a discussion of dharma ethics in general are contained in the first two parts of the book. The controversy surrounding a literal versus allegorical interpretations of the Gita has long been simmering, but Matilal’s subtle and thorough analysis of the issues takes the debate to a new level. At the beginning of the Gita the field of battle is called the “field of dharma,” but Matilal explains this in a nonallegorical way as “the field where the seeds of moral merit/demerit are sown in order to bring forth the harvest of karma or just desert” (93). Matilal also observes that it is simply not correct, as the allegorical interpretation implies, that the Kauravas embody all evil and the Pandavas symbolize everything good. Even Gandhi, the most famous nonliteral reader, switches to a literal reading in the end. Gandhi paraphrases Krishna’s advise to Arjuna in this way: “You have already committed violence. By talking now like a wise man, you will not learn nonviolence. Having started on this course, you must finish the job.”

Matilal reminds his readers (9) that kshatriyas did not always have to kill if duty required it. Arjuna once vowed that he would kill anyone who insulted his famous bow. Arjuna was just about to kill Yudhisthira for this reason, but Krishna rebuked him for making such a rash decision. On the same page, Matilal retells the story of the sage Kaushika, who told the truth about the whereabouts of a man that some ruffians wanted to kill. Again Krishna condemns a person for wanting to kill or allowing a death for the sake of truth-telling or promise-keeping. Matilal contends that these virtues are just as important for a kshatriya as are his warrior duties.

Not only does Krishna advise suspending some ethical rules to avoid a greater evil, he also exhorts warriors to violate the rules of engagement laid out specifically in the text. When Karna’s chariot gets stuck in the mud, Arjuna knows very well that it would be wrong to take advantage of him, but Krishna tells him to attack anyway. (Rama takes his own liberties by shooting Valin, one of his own devotees, in the back. Only some very contorted arguments save him from this high crime.) Krishna also tricks Drona, Arjuna’s revered teacher whose prowess made the Kauravas invincible, into thinking that his son has been killed, and Arjuna takes advantage of the grieving father to kill him. (Matilal confesses that this is “one of the darkest deeds of our ’dark Lord’ Krishna” [95].) When Arjuna discovers the stratagem, he condemns Krishna, but the latter counters that it is the only way that the Pandavas can win the war. This is the same reason Krishna gives Bhima when he encourages him to hit below the belt in his duel with Duryodhana. Krishna is expedient, antinomian, and hypocritical, but he insists that Arjuna conform to a rigid moral standard in initiating the battle.

Matilal observes (39) that only Draupadi, the common wife of the Pandava brothers, has any sense of human rights (including the fair treatment of women) and universal moral law. He mentions Draupadi’s outrage at the trick that led to Drona’s death, but he neglects to follow through with her complete indictment. Giving the lie to the idea all the characters saw the Bharata war as inevitable, Draupadi condemns Krishna, whom she admits to be “the Lord God, the Self-subsistent, the primal Grandsire,” for hurting “one creature by means of another, … playing with his creatures as children play with dolls” (Mahabharata 3.31.34-7). Yudhishthira is shocked at his wife’s blasphemy and defends Krishna in ways very similar to that of Job’s friends defending Yahweh. Are Krishna and Yahweh yet more examples of male deities behaving badly, far worse than their own devotees?

In defense of Krishna some argue that he did everything that he could to bring the feuding family together, but the parties ignored his advice and continued upon the road to war. Once the battles lines were drawn in the capitals and then on the battlefield, it was too late to turn back. Krishna’s position appeared to be that once war was engaged, it had to be won even with immoral and illegal means. At this point Arjuna’s plan to go to the forest and meditate was, as Gandhi once said, just as irrational and foolish as jumping off a train traveling at high speed. Furthermore, Matilal also reminds us (100) that Hindu theology does not have a strong view of divine power. In fact, just as in Greek religion, fate (daiva) rules over both gods and humans (430). After the war the hermit Utanka criticizes Krishna’s actions, but he defends himself by claiming that he did not have the power to stop the fighting. As Matilal states: “He was mightier than anybody else but he was not omnipotent” (100).

Matilal finds both utilitarianism and Kantianism in the Hindu epics. A caricature of Kantianism is found in Rama, whose inflexibility with regard to duty leads to absurd and/or harsh decisions. As Matilal quips: “Rama’s dharma was rigid; Krishna’s was flaccid” (47). Even though he was encouraged to do so by the sage Jabala, Rama, unlike Krishna, was not going to break a promise, even if it meant that he could regain his kingdom and avoid 14 years of exile. One of Rama’s lame excuses for shooting Valin in the back was that a person has no duties to animals, Valin being a member of Hanuman’s monkey army. (But Kant said that mistreatment of animals was blameworthy at least as a reflection of the person’s character.) Rama’s extreme interpretation of a wife’s duty to her husband has led generations of Indian women to try to conform to an impossible ideal. Following Sita’s example, Indian women are required to stay with their husbands no matter what they ask of them and no matter how much they are abused.

The principle of utility is implied in Krishna’s justification of immoral means to prevent the evil Kauravas from winning the war. Yudhisthira once said that there are many dharmas and the only way to find the correct one is to follow the mahajana, which can be translated as “the conduct of the good people.” In this term Matilal finds a “primitive proto-utilitarianism,” which is very clearly expressed in the common phrase “for the sake of the happiness of many people, and for the sake of the good of many” (68). Matilal acknowledges that the greatest attraction of utilitarianism is its monism, i.e., its assumption that all moral problems can be solved with a single principle. He claims, however, that “dharma- morality is pluralistic”(68), and he proposes that this view can be held without succumbing to irrationality. Matilal’s frequent mention of “practical wisdom” as the deciding factor in moral decision-making suggests that we should look at Hindu ethics from a virtue perspective. I propose that “the conduct of good people” be read as a call to emulate the virtuous.

If dharma is duty then Hindu ethics should conform to something like Kantianism, but Matilal demonstrates that is not really the meaning of dharma. If he is correct in his historical explication of the term, the development of the term dharma is very similar to that of the Chinese li. Both terms originally referred to a set of religious rituals that later become more formalized as moral rules. The Chandogya Upanishad speaks of three forms of dharma: rituals, study of scripture, and austerities (2.23.1). Even in this expanded form, dharma is not universal moral law. Matilal quotes Robert Lingat favorably when he maintains that dharma is never “imposed” but simply “proposed”; and he paraphrases Louis Dumont’s idea that dharma “reigns from above without actually governing the world” (42). Both of these descriptions are intriguing but vague, but Matilal at least concludes that dharma is “open ended,” a crucial aspect of rules in virtue ethics.

The virtue interpretation of dharma comes into focus when we look at some very specific definitions and instances of its expression. In the Varnaparvan of the Mahabharata King Nahusha asks Yudhisthira what dharma is, and he defines it as the virtues of truthfulness, generosity, forgiveness, goodness, kindness, self-control, and compassion. Going completely against caste determinism, Yudhisthira contends that a shudra having these qualities would actually be a brahman, and if a brahman lacks them he would be a shudra.

If you think in terms of human evolution, it was the virtues that came first and only afterward moral rules. (This is especially true if we assume that the conception of rules requires language and that early humans, such as the compassionate Neanderthals, had no language.) This means that moral rules are actually abstractions from the practice of the virtues, just as moral prohibitions are abstractions from the practice of the vices. Therefore, no moral rule could “reign from above” nor could it even “propose” without the specific moral content that action and the virtues provide. Interestingly enough, moral rules, even as abstractions, still preserve their normative force. Therefore, dharma can indeed “propose” as a general guide for action, but it must always be contextualized and individualized.

Matilal’s greatest contribution in this book is his discussion of karma and how it has been misunderstood: “The karma doctrine requires that man’s own ’character’ be his own ’destiny’“ (414). This statement supports my thesis about a Hindu virtue ethics and also allows us to confront the challenge of fatalism. Matilal makes a strong case for separating karma from caste and suggests that the concept of karma is compatible with both reason and individual responsibility. He argues that karma was originally introduced to solve the problem of evil and to answer the fatalism found in the Ajivaka school (412). Karma’s link to fatalism occurred only it was linked to caste heredity.

The Buddha once said that “they who know causation know the dharma,” and I propose that this motto relates to character as destiny and also to Matilal’s thesis that karma supports moral freedom and responsibility. (As Matilal observes, karma is indistinguishable from fate only if one is ignorant of all the causal threads.) Those who know their own causal web of existence, especially noting how their actions affect themselves and others, will be able to develop the cardinal virtue of mindfulness. If they know the truth (i.e., the true facts of their lives), then they will then know what to do. The truths they discover by means of this formula will be very personal truths, moral and spiritual truths that are, as Aristotle says of moral virtues, “relative to us.” Furthermore, the famous “mirror of Dharma” is not a common one that people all look into together, as some later Buddhists believed, but it is actually a myriad of mirrors reflecting individual histories. Finally, we can see how character is destiny, and as long as a compatibilist justification for moral freedom is accepted, we can say that those who are unmindful and do not develop the virtues are destined to experience the truth that the vices are their own punishment.

Matilal gives support to my virtue thesis: “A moral agent exercises his practical wisdom, and also learns from the experiences he passes through during his life. He has an enriched practical wisdom when it is informed by his experiences of genuine moral dilemmas. A moral agent needs also a character which is nothing but a disposition to act and react appropriately with moral concerns” (33). This is precisely how Aristotle’s relative mean operates (right time, right place, etc.) and also how the Confucian concept of yi works as a personal appropriation of the norms of li. Matilal’s scholarship allows me to do something that I thought that I could not do in my own comparative virtue ethics–namely, to add Krishna to the Buddha, Confucius, and Aristotle.

The problem of course is that Krishna appears to be the least virtuous person in this list and can hardly be seen as practitioner of the Middle Way. Nonetheless, Matilal declares that his “dark Lord” is a “paradigmatic person … in the moral field,” who “becomes a perspectivist and understands the contingency of the human situation”(34), both necessary elements of virtue ethics. He also describes him, as opposed to the rigid Rama or Yudhisthira, as an “imaginative poet” in the moral realm: “He is the poet who accepts the constraints of metres, verses, and metaphors. But he is also the strong poet who has absolute control over them… . He governs from above but does not dictate.” This guarantees that Krishna’s “flexibility never means the ’anything goes’ kind of morality” (34).

If Krishna is not omnipotent in the Judeo-Christian sense, then Matilal cannot claim that Krishna has “absolute control over the metres”; nor is it advisable to have him governing them from above. Nonetheless, the fine arts, I believe, give us a very rich analogue for the development and performance of the virtues. Most significantly, this analogy allows us to confirm both normativity and creative individuality at the same time. A violin virtuoso does not leave out a note or instruction from the original score, but she or he offers a unique interpretation of the piece. Even the best judges are praised for craft excellence in their very distinctive decisions based on an unchanging law. Similarly, every younger brother appropriates li in his own way in respecting his elder brother. It is the virtues and practical reason that allows us to navigate the river of law with its constant flow and identity but also its shifting banks and channels.

Not only does practical reason guide us in choosing a mean relative to us, it also allows us to suspend the law when it is in danger of “becoming an ass” à la Dickens. Dharma “gets fulfilled in novel and mysterious ways” (42), so it may be expressed in violation of law or duty. For example, the Pandava brothers were so concerned about retrieving some sacrificial sticks that they were punished for their ritualistic rigidity by a yaksha (disguised as a stork and symbolizing dharma). (Significantly enough, Yudhisthira, the only brother not punished, then discovers that dharma is the “conduct of good people” discussed above.) One of my favorite examples comes from the Confucian Mencius who said that li forbids any man from touching woman not directly related to him; but if your sister-in-law is drowning, then by all means you should extend your hand to save her. When we look back at the Krishna’s suspension of the rules of war, his justification, compared to these examples, does not appear compelling at all.

The third part of the book deals with cultural and ethical relativism and the best chapter is entitled “Pluralism, Relativism, and Interaction between Cultures.” Matilal begins with some definitions and then offers some good insights about current issues in political philosophy. He defines “singularism” as a position that denies that there can be more than one conception of the good, whereas “pluralism” is of course the view that there are multiple goods among which citizens should be free to choose. On the other hand, a relativist is one who believes that the values of one society are just as good as another’s. While some conservatives hold to singularism, Matilal believes that this is a mistake on their part. I believe that Matilal is correct in insisting that genuine conservatives, at least ones who wish to live in today’s liberal democracies, should give up singularism and join the pluralists. At the same time Matilal advises liberals that they should not be relativists.

The fourth section is a fascinating collection of articles on drugs and religion, Transcendental Meditation, and the Hare Krishna movement, on which I will not comment because of lack of space. The fifth and last section deals with topics in the philosophy of religion, and Matilal’s best contributions come on the nature of evil. Euro-American philosophers of religion will be surprised to learn that the Indian tradition offers a middle ground between the free-will defense of evil and the atheist-naturalist elimination of the problem. I have already commented on the qualified omnipotence in Hindu theology and this is central to Indian theodicy. The Indians reject creatio ex nihilo and affirm the eternity of the world and souls. This eliminates the problem of what I call “metaphysical evil”: finitude, deficiency, corruptibility, and nonbeing. Augustine claims that Adam and Eve fell because of their deficient wills, but they obviously cannot be responsible for anything that God has created for them. The typical Indian God creates each cosmic cycle from a preexisting matter that follows its own laws, including the law of karma. Once again, if compatibilism is an acceptable solution to the free-will problem, then agents are responsible for their own actions.

Matilal’s arguments are consistently good and persuasive and only one chapter, the one on Ramakrishna, stands out as a failure. Matilal claims that the great Bengali saint is an embodiment of prajna, which he translates as “practical reason.” It seems to me that Ramakrishna does not follow the Middle Way of ancient virtue ethics; rather, he fits very well Wendy Doniger’s idea of the Golden Extremes. (The boy Krishna is also a good example of this.) As a failed Tantric, Ramakrishna does not go through the full dialectic of opposites. He may appear to be what Nietzsche called the “child,” the end result of the Three Metamorphoses beginning with the camel and the lion. But Nietzsche’s child is a mature person who incorporates the spontaneity of the child, while it is clear to me that Ramakrishna remains very much in an infantile stage.

Matilal also claims that Ramakrishna is “Vedanta Incarnate” (15), but his promise to prove this thesis is unfulfilled. When Totapuri came to Dakshineswar, he tried to convince Ramakrishna that nirguna Brahman was superior to the worship of the Mother, but, ironically, it was a vision of the Mother that ultimately saved Totapuri from his attempt to drown himself in the Ganges. If it is neo-Vedanta that Matilal means, then we have much more sophisticated and satisfying expressions of that view in Vivekananda and Aurobindo.