Ethics and Foreign Intervention

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Chatterjee, Deen K. and Scheid, Don E. (eds.), Ethics and Foreign Intervention, Cambridge, 2003, 316pp, $21.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521009049.

Reviewed by Robert L. Holmes, University of Rochester


This book deals, not with foreign intervention in general, as its title would suggest, but with so-called “humanitarian intervention” (or more precisely, “humanitarian military intervention” as the editors label it). The issue is whether states may intervene in the internal affairs of other states for the protection of innocent persons within the borders of those states. Sovereignty, if taken as an absolute value, would preclude it. So, on the face of it, would international law as enshrined in the UN Charter. But both the practice of states in recent decades and the growing emphasis upon human rights worldwide, would seem to render humanitarian intervention permissible or even obligatory when necessary to prevent abominations like massacres or genocide. This book explores both the legal and ethical dimensions of the issue.

The book’s four sections deal with conceptual and normative issues, just-war perspectives, secession and international law, and the critique of interventionism. Some of the essays are highly theoretical; others deal at least in part with specific cases, such as those of Bosnia or Kosovo. The authors include philosophers, political scientists, and specialists in international relations, many of them prominent in their fields. Their contributions were written specifically for this volume.

Although the authors differ widely in the perspectives they bring to the issue, they differ little in their conclusions. They do not view sovereignty as an absolute value. Many say that it is conditional, depending upon the respect states pay to the rights of persons within their borders. Virtually all say that states may sometimes intervene in other states for humanitarian purposes. Indeed, much of the discussion deals not so much with whether humanitarian intervention is justified as with when it is justified and for what reasons.

Some, like Stanley Hoffman, in the lead article, clearly favor humanitarian intervention (“We owe it to the victims of internal crises and crimes”) but without a clear account of what justifies it. Claiming that traditional just war criteria are not fully adequate, he puts the challenge to defenders of humanitarian intervention to undertake “a realistic assessment of the magnitude of their task” (28). He himself looks forward to a new world order that gives greater priority to individual rights.

Others, like George R. Lucas, Jr. likewise favor intervention but provide detailed criteria to justify it. With Hoffman, he believes just war criteria are inadequate. He says, “[t]here is a straightforward, almost pedestrian, sense in which jus ad bellum does not apply to humanitarian operations; they are not, nor are they intended to be, acts of war on the part of the intervening forces” (77). Humanitarian intervention aims at enforcement of justice, protection of rights, and restoration of law and order. Thus we need a jus ad pacem to complement jus ad bellum. Its criteria, patterned after those of just war theory (just cause, legitimate authority, right intention, etc.) will be specifically tailored to govern humanitarian intervention.

Still others focus more specifically upon the question of what one is justified in doing in the course of humanitarian intervention. Henry Shue analyzes bombing strategies as they apply to dual-purpose facilities. Although conceding its apparent legality in terms of the definition of military objectives in the 1977 Protocol additional to the 1949 Geneva Convention, Shue argues that the NATO bombing campaign against Serbia in 1999 “flagrantly violated the principle of discrimination by intentionally causing civilian distress as a means to producing acceptance by Milosevic of NATO’S terms” (114).

Erin Kelly finds the notion of corporate liability for wrongs done by a group (that is, holding the group liable but not individual members) inadequate to justify fully the infliction of harms in humanitarian intervention. She argues for a conception of distributive collective liability, in which it is the individual members of errant groups who are held liable. Insofar as distributive justice provides an account of how to distribute burdens as well as benefits, her account can be regarded as an account of distributive justice in cases of harms to be inflicted in humanitarian interventions (“a fair distribution of the costs of alleviating serious injustice” (133). Dismissing the idea that rights are absolute, she not only maintains that the rights of innocent persons may sometimes justifiably be violated in such actions, but also that many members of such groups actually lose their rights not to be harmed. The upshot of her position, differing significantly from standard just war jus in bello criteria, is that “harming civilians, perhaps even deliberately, is not necessary prohibited” (135).

Tom J. Farrer, Christine Chwaszcza and Allen Buchanan contribute useful discussions of different dimensions of the question of whether humanitarian intervention is justifiable in the cases of harms committed in the course of secession and the attempts to repress it.

Michael Blake sees the need for a new approach to “international liberal justice.” He explores the problems of sovereignty in light of Rawlsian liberalism. If stability at the international level is sought through reciprocity, that is, agreement among all of the parties affected, there is still the possibility that justice for individual persons within the entities that are parties to the agreement will be sacrificed. Stability and equality are achievable within states, he maintains, but not readily achievable at the international level. What he calls an “ethics of disequilibrium” will not privilege agreement among states. Generally disfavoring intervention, Blake seems in the end to settle for a utilitarian calculus: “Intervention is prohibited where the costs of such intervention would not be justified by the good to be accomplished” (66). Though he does not say so in so many words, one gets the impression that he favors intervention where the costs would be justified by the good to be accomplished. If so, his would be a consequentialist justification of humanitarian intervention rather than a deontological one (on balance) of the sort that just war theory might provide.

The deepest venture into ethical theory in connection with the issue is Chris Brown’s, “Selective humanitarianism: in defense of inconsistency.” The issue of consistency arises when we ask: Why intervene in one situation and not in another? Given that we can’t intervene in all of the areas of the world in which human rights abuses take place, why some and not others? Citing critics like Chomsky and Luttwak, Brown acknowledges that U.S. policy seems not to be based on a moral rule. But he questions whether a search for a moral rule is the right way to go in the first place. Indeed, he maintains that “the demand that the United States and other Western countries formulate an uncompromising and universal principle which will tell them when to intervene and when not to intervene, is fundamentally misconceived” (43). After a cursory discussion of virtue ethics, Brown emphasizes the importance of judgment as opposed to the application of a rule or principle. He does allow that the application of a principle, say, like the Categorical Imperative, can involve the making of judgments, but he apparently believes that even then a principle-oriented ethics falls short of the demands of a virtue ethic. The problem with virtue ethics, he recognizes, is that states are not persons, and it is unclear what it would mean for them to cultivate virtues. The just-war tradition, he seems to think, is a good starting point for trying to decide whether a particular intervention is justified. With its range of criteria, it requires taking account of many facets of the situation one is facing. But in just-war theory there is still a tendency to reduce decision-making to the application of rules, which Brown resists. In the end he calls for the cultivation of moral sensitivity among leaders and the making of the best judgments they can. While it is difficult to be certain of the actual position he ends up with, this has the look of a kind of existentialist or situation ethic applied to humanitarian intervention.

In a related vein, Richard W. Miller argues for an approach that disavows the search for a single “master value” on which to base intervention. It insists instead on “the diversity and variable rank of the relevant considerations and seeks specific constellations of reasons, frequently realized in actual situations, which sustain a case for or against intervention” (215ff.). Indirectly critical of U.S. policy to a greater degree than most of the other contributors, he speaks of the “hypocrisy of world powers, above all, the sole superpower” (216). More cynicism toward U.S. policy, he believes, “might more often tip the balance against dangerous and hegemonic intervention processes, while favoring rescues that genuinely serve human interests worldwide” (245).

Iris Marion Young usefully brings to bear upon the discussion an analysis of power and violence, inspired by Hannah Arendt, and C.A.J. Coady explores the problems humanitarian intervention creates for just war theory which, in its more recent forms, allows only wars in self defense, which the use of force for humanitarian purposes is not, or at least is not primarily. Both, in the end, however, allow the permissibility of humanitarian intervention in some cases.

The volume makes a useful contribution to the growing discussion of humanitarian intervention. It should be particularly valuable to those who have already decided that humanitarian intervention is justifiable and want to understand better the possible moral and legal rationales for it. There is, however, little here to challenge conventional thinking on the fundamental moral issue. No firm moral opposition to humanitarian intervention is defended by any of the authors. No pacifist perspective is represented in the readings, and there is no exploration of nonviolent alternatives to the forceful repression or overthrow of oppressive regimes.