Ethics and Philosophical Critique in William James

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Sarin Marchetti, Ethics and Philosophical Critique in William James, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 291pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137541772.

Reviewed by Sami Pihlström, University of Helsinki


William James, one of the classical American pragmatists, is not habitually read as a moral philosopher. On the contrary, it is often claimed that he authored just a single essay focusing on ethics, "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life" (1891).[1] In a sense this is clearly true; there is no book or any other comprehensive work by him on ethics in the way in which his major works cover such fields as epistemology, metaphysics, philosophical psychology, philosophy (and psychology) of religion, and (somewhat notoriously) the theory of truth -- or in the way in which other pragmatists, such as John Dewey, wrote treatises on ethics. However, James scholars have increasingly, and compellingly, argued that James was not only a serious moral thinker but that his philosophical work as a whole is permeated by ethical concerns. Perhaps the reason why there is no (or hardly any) specific work on ethics in James's oeuvre is that ethics is everywhere in what he thought and wrote. It has, as Sarin Marchetti puts it, a character of "pervasivity" (250).

Marchetti's book is an intriguing representative of what can be regarded as a new wave of studies on James's moral thought. He reads James as a philosopher seeking to challenge the very methods and goals of ethics, or even our conception of what ethics is and means for us, both in our ordinary lives and as an area of philosophical inquiry. Thus, Marchetti's approach is, as he notes himself, metaphilosophical: he deals with the nature, aims, and methodology of ethical inquiry. He also talks about James's "meta-moral philosophy" (249), but this is not to be conflated with "metaethical" inquiry in the sense in which mainstream analytic moral philosophers speak of metaethics, contrasting it with normative and applied ethics. Instead, Marchetti's metaphilosophical investigation of James is always already "applied" in the sense that it is never detached from concrete individual and social problems. James leads us to question the standard distinctions between metaethics, normative ethics, and applied ethics. Such distinctions rely on a conception of moral inquiry James seeks to liberate us from -- and here Marchetti offers some help.

The book is clearly structured -- though the author's writing style is not always equally clear. After the relatively brief introduction, chapter 1 (still largely introductory) places James's pragmatism in the context of "therapeutical" moral philosophy moving from theoretical systems to a self-examination of one's moral life. Chapter 2 turns to "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life", offering one of the most detailed readings of this essay available in the scholarly literature. Chapter 3 takes up James's monumental The Principles of Psychology (1890), arguing that the kind of ethical focus on "practices of the self" that Jamesian moral philosophy emphasizes can already be found in that work. Chapter 4 turns to James's best-known pragmatist writings, including Pragmatism (1907) and The Meaning of Truth (1909), suggesting that the so-called theory of truth offered in those books in fact also serves the kind of moral self-reflection that is argued to be the core of James's philosophy. Chapter 5 investigates James's legacy in political thought -- correcting the widespread misconception of James as a naïve individualist disengaged from social and political issues. Finally, the concluding chapter investigates the way in which Jamesian pragmatism might actually revolutionize moral philosophy in general and paves the way for further inquiry.

Marchetti has an excellent command of James's works and obviously knows most of the secondary literature worth knowing. Both older and more recent contributions to scholarship are frequently cited along with the primary sources. Marchetti is also bold enough to walk his own path as a reader of James. While his interpretation shares a lot of common ground with other (as he says, "heterodox") readings of James, most notably Sergio Franzese's,[2] he follows no one and takes no previous views for granted. There is no doubt, then, that he is one of the strongest voices in the younger generation of James scholars, and there is much to applaud in his comprehensive articulation and reconstruction of Jamesian metaphilosophy of ethical inquiry. Marchetti's work is also most welcome in the sense that it not only offers a careful interpretation of James's ideas (from an admittedly controversial perspective) but also shows us how we should, if we take James seriously, continue to philosophize about moral problems, both within professional philosophy and in our individual and social lives.

Despite the freshness of the topic and the approach, Marchetti writes a bit heavily, and it is occasionally challenging to identify a clear argument in his rather long chapters and sections. The book could easily have been shorter; there is considerable repetition that could have been avoided relatively easily. In the first chapter in particular, the reader hopes the author would finally get to his real business after having explained at great length what he is planning to do and why.[3] Having said all this, I do find the book a valuable contribution to our understanding of James. In the remainder of this review, I will focus only on what I take to be some of the most interesting issues Marchetti examines.[4]

In chapter 1, Marchetti sketches his general argument for reading James as a philosopher engaged in, and urging us to engage in, "exhortative or hortatory ethics" (18, 21ff.). We should drop the foundationalist system-building of traditional moral philosophy and engage in continuous critical transformative self-reflection focusing on the moral practices we engage in and the moral problems we personally encounter. Thus, not only is there no utilitarian or consequentialist moral theory in James; there is no moral theory at all. Rather, James argues against the very project of constructing such a systematic theory and in favor of something like therapeutic "self-cultivation" (22) -- thus joining a classical conception of ethical thought that can be traced back to antiquity. The goal of philosophy in general is "personal conversion" rather than a theoretical system (26); here, Marchetti suggests, James can be compared to thinkers like Emerson and Wittgenstein.[5] In ethics, in particular, this kind of self-transformation means learning to see things in new ways, learning to adopt novel attitudes to the world around us. Developing our moral "vision" is crucial (200).

This basic message of James's moral thought is repeated throughout the book. Chapter 2 articulates this position through an extended critical exposition of "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life", seeking to rescue that anti-theoretical article from foundationalist (e.g., consequentialist) interpretations. I have no complaints about this way of reading James -- indeed, I think this is the correct way of understanding his approach to moral problems and the nature of the moral self. What is perhaps more controversial (albeit also, in my view, plausible) is the general claim that pragmatism as a philosophical method also incorporates a fundamentally ethical intention based on this conception of ethics as self-transformation and -cultivation (e.g., 33). The most significant message of Marchetti's investigation is in fact the thoroughly ethical character of James's pragmatism as a whole -- including his controversial conception of truth.

Again, I find Marchetti touching an extremely important and widely neglected point when he maintains that James is not primarily advancing a theory of truth but "using pragmatism to unstiffen our views on truth and put them to work" (169). We are invited to rethink the meaning of truth "in our lives", and James is therefore offering us a "genealogical phenomenology" of this concept (177). Pragmatism, James maintains, "transforms the absolutely empty notion of correspondence in a rich and active relationship between our truths and the way in which we can entertain them and thus engage the world" (184). Truth is, then, something that dynamically functions in our ethical world-engagement, not just a static relation between our beliefs (which are not static, either, but habits of action) and an allegedly independent external world. The concept of truth is also interestingly entangled with James's important but often neglected metaphor of blindness: "We are morally blind when we fail to see how the sources of truth are nested in the very meaning those experiences have for those who have them" (202). The most serious blindness, moreover, is our losing touch "with the meaning of our own truths and experiences" (205).

However, Marchetti offers less by way of detailed argumentation regarding the relation between this pragmatist rethinking of truth and the more traditional philosophical controversies over truth and realism. Accordingly, one of my basic worries here concerns the status of metaphysics in pragmatism. Marchetti's James is rather strongly opposed to (at least traditional) metaphysics. I am not fully convinced that Marchetti is sufficiently responsive to the idea of reconstructing not only ethics but also metaphysics through the pragmatic method. In particular, James, we are told, will have nothing to do with "transcendental or metaphysical anchorage", "transcendental constitution", or "transcendental arguments" (92-95, 184). On the other hand, in many interesting though perhaps not fully obvious ways James develops further some Kantian insights, especially regarding the relation between ethics and religion. This point cannot be argued here, though.[6] Admittedly, Marchetti is not completely hostile to metaphysics, as he also seeks to show how James's "metaphysical and religious assumptions" may be "part of one's ethical outlook without constituting a necessary ingredient in it" (112), i.e., "may touch our interiority as moral agents" while not being a necessary condition for moral life (116). This, I think, is correct. It is important to note the central role played by religious ideas in James's philosophy while arguing that Jamesian pragmatism (and moral philosophy) is compatible with a secular outlook.

The issue of (moral) realism is in any event one of the dimensions of metaphysical and ethical inquiry that inevitably becomes urgent as we move on our Jamesian way of moral reflection. Clearly, James is very far from the contemporary metaethical moral realism debates. However, given that Marchetti repeatedly speaks about, e.g., our "worldmaking", "ways of worldmaking", or even "our ordinary practices of world-making" (25, 118, 160-161, 168, 187, 237, 251) -- curiously, without explicit reference to Nelson Goodman -- it might be asked how exactly his brand of Jamesian pragmatism fits into the on-going discussion of pragmatism and realism, both generally and regarding morality in particular.

A crucial feature of Jamesian pragmatism (or pragmatic realism) and of the related conception of the ethical "transformation of our interiority", as Marchetti puts it, is the fact that "what we are willing to even acknowledge as real is revelatory of important features of our subjectivity and mindset" (41). This acknowledgment is not only metaphysical and epistemological but also ethical; the very project of dealing with reality in an epistemic and ontological sense is based on our valuational attitudes -- as also other pragmatists, notably Hilary Putnam, have argued in their criticisms of the fact/value dichotomy. Thus, there is no fundamental division between ethics and metaphysics in (Jamesian) pragmatism; these are inextricably entangled.[7]

Now, it could be argued that Marchetti, or Marchetti's James, to some extent neglects one very important object of ethico-metaphysical acknowledgment, namely, the reality of evil and suffering (though Marchetti does acknowledge the "tragic dimension" in James; see 100, 152). Given his overall approach to James, I find it surprising that he has so little to say about the importance of the reality of evil and suffering in James's thought. After all, Pragmatism in a way puts forward the problem of evil as a frame within which the very development of the pragmatic method -- which, I agree with Marchetti, ties ethics closely with metaphysics and epistemology -- takes place.[8] The part of reality that needs to be especially strongly acknowledged by the moral subject is the real suffering that individuals (and social groups) go through in their lives. Any attempt to declare such suffering as somehow less-than-real -- e.g., Leibnizian or Hegelian theodicy -- is, from the Jamesian point of view, a colossal failure of ethical (and metaphysical) acknowledgment. Insofar as our ethical lives, according to James, are crucially based on our perspectival and selective "attention . . . to aspects of reality" (199), the reality of evil is undeniably there to demand our attention. It would have been interesting to read more about Marchetti's thoughts on this, possibly with some references to the (admittedly brief) discussions of the problem of evil in Pragmatism and elsewhere. A study on James's ethics that sets this problem aside remains incomplete.

Even with these minor problems and (what I take to be) omissions, Marchetti is a perceptive reader of James and touches something important in pragmatism generally when he writes:

According to James there is a common menace haunting both our mental and our moral lives: it is our tendency to portray those as fields in which our personal contribution is unnecessary; or worse, unwelcome. While in the psychological case this leads to an understanding of the mind as a given and of our stance toward experiencing as a passive one, in the ethical case it leads to a picture of moral life as the dead respect of rules and principles, conceived independently of any personal contribution. These companion attitudes lead to mental and moral conservatism: two tendencies of the human soul that, according to James, attentive philosophical reflection should individuate, explore, and finally eradicate. (158)

As this is a key task for philosophy in general, we need scholarly contributions like Marchetti's. Since his book helps us in actually putting Jamesian pragmatism to use in our rethinking of what morality means for us, it is, despite its shortcomings, valuable reading not only for James scholars but for anyone with an interest in ethics -- and who wouldn't have such an interest?

[1] This essay is available in William James, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (1897) and was republished, e.g., in the critical Harvard edition of this book in the nineteen-volume series, The Works of William James, eds. Frederick H. Burkhardt, Fredson Bowers, and Ignas K. Skrupskelis (Harvard University Press, 1979).

[2] Sergio Franzese, The Ethics of Energy: William James's Moral Philosophy in Focus (Ontos, 2008). I have also benefited from Franzese's approach in my own work on James; see, e.g., my entry on William James in Hugh LaFollette (ed.), International Encyclopedia of Ethics (Blackwell, 2013). Marchetti agrees with Franzese's anti-theoretical interpretation of James (and especially "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life") but claims that Franzese is one-sidedly negative in his interpretation and leaves too little space for positive moral reflection and self-transformation in James (56-57, 73-75).

[3] Marchetti aptly notes that his reconstruction resembles "tentative prolegomena to James's own impressionistic prolegomena to ethics" (41). This is exactly how it feels to read, too.

[4] In particular, I will set aside the very important discussion of James's relevance to social and political philosophy (chapter 5). I just note with satisfaction that Marchetti is not alone in correcting the received view of James as an extreme individualist with no interest in social and political matters; see also, e.g., Trygve Throntveit, William James and the Quest for an Ethical Republic (Palgrave, 2014).

[5] It is natural to compare the picture of ethics Marchetti finds in James with the loose tradition known as "Wittgensteinian moral philosophy" (see also 253-257). Toward the end of the book, Marchetti tells us that his next monograph will deal with post-pragmatist yet analogous ethical approaches, such as Wittgensteinianism and virtue ethics (257ff.).

[6] Cf. Sami Pihlström, Pragmatic Pluralism and the Problem of God (Fordham University Press, 2013). Furthermore, when Marchetti says that for James "the very idea of a 'reality independent of human thinking' is nowhere to be found" (191), a comparison to Kant's theory of the thing in itself would be a natural step to take. He does speak about James's "Kantian" point, though, but leaves this somewhat vague (193).

[7] Putnam's and many other neopragmatists' and contemporary pragmatism scholars' influence on the kind of picture of ethics arguably emerging from Jamesian pragmatism is duly acknowledged by Marchetti throughout the book. Among Putnam's numerous relevant works here, see Hilary Putnam, The Collapse of the Fact/Value Dichotomy and Other Essays (Harvard University Press, 2002). Cf. also Sami Pihlström, Pragmatist Metaphysics: An Essay on the Ethical Grounds of Ontology (Continuum, 2009).

[8] William James, Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking (1907), available in The Works of William James, eds. Burkhardt et al., 1975; see Lectures I and VIII.