Ethics and Public Policy: A Philosophical Inquiry

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Jonathan Wolff, Ethics and Public Policy: A Philosophical Inquiry, Routledge, 2011, 230pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415668538.

Reviewed by Daniel Halliday, University of Melbourne


Questions of public policy are fraught with ethical complications. Accordingly, those responsible for making decisions about policy often can't avoid taking a stance on some difficult moral issue. Many philosophers would no doubt like to think that policy-making might benefit if more attention were paid to philosophical theorising. This might be right, but policy-makers can hardly be expected to work through large amounts of contemporary philosophical material, navigating all of the disagreement and often revisionary proposals in which philosophers indulge. Jonathan Wolff's Ethics and Public Policy: A Philosophical Inquiry is a sustained discussion of how philosophical reasoning can actually be put to work in ways directly helpful to policy-making. In the course of this admirable book, Wolff addresses a diverse range of problems faced by policy makers, in each case providing an account of how philosophical theorising can make a meaningful contribution.

A source of this book's strength is the fact that Wolff has spent a good deal of time involved in policy-making himself. This is evident in the supply of real cases, drawn from policy-making projects in which Wolff was involved. (I might note, incidentally, that this supply is higher in some chapters than in others. Wolff seems to draw more extensively on his own policy-making experiences in the chapters on gambling and safety, for example, than in the chapters on punishment and disability.) Being a professional moral philosopher as well, Wolff is perhaps uniquely placed to identify where real policy debates can draw on philosophical inquiry. Indeed, one would be very hard pressed to find another book that combines such depth of actual policy-making experience with command of philosophical theory.

Because Wolff's book is about real policy problems, the reader learns a great deal about the sort of considerations that give policy debates a moral dimension. Some of these are particularly striking. For example, I learned that money donated to charity that aims to fight a certain disease is highly likely to help pay for a painful experiment on animals (14), that the power of gambling addictions has led to children suffocating in cars parked outside casinos (50), and that the US government places a monetary value on preventing a fatality that is more than four times that set by the British government (95).

The book's qualities of course exceed a mere supply of intriguing real-world cases. (It is worth adding that the book nevertheless demonstrates how to do some good moral philosophy without relying on hypothetical examples, whatever their intellectual merits). Wolff's objectives are pursued over nine chapters, eight of which address a particular policy problem. Chapter one explores the problem of scientific experiments on animals, focusing on the way in which public policy may be guided by taking into account various morally relevant properties of animals, an approach that contrasts somewhat with the more familiar philosophical question of what moral status consists in. Chapters two and three discuss the regulation of gambling and recreational drug use, both dealing with related themes of liberalism, paternalism, and the significance of harm. Chapter four's subject is safety, and especially the vexed question of how much money ought to be spent on reducing the number of fatalities. Crime and punishment are discussed in chapter five, with particular attention given to 'communicative' or 'expressive' theories of punishment. Chapter six is on healthcare reform, with a focus on the social determinants of health. Chapter seven concentrates on disability, and is largely a comparison between different conceptions of egalitarianism. The moral limits of the free market are discussed in chapter eight. The book's final chapter is presented as a general conclusion about the role of philosophy in public policy debates, drawing together themes from earlier chapters. This is followed by a short section on further reading, and a more extensive bibliography of works cited in the chapters.

Rather than give a more extensive exposition of each chapter, it is probably more instructive (given the book's aims and scope) to say more about the general method used in approaching these topics. Wolff distances himself from the view that philosophy can contribute to policy debates by way of supplying grand theoretical positions that may then be simply applied to real-life problems. Academic philosophy is (nowadays at least) rather ill-suited to this role. As Wolff remarks in the introduction, debate among philosophers errs more towards disagreement than agreement, and the profession tends to reward revisionary or novel proposals that stand little chance of ever appealing (or being intelligible) to policy makers. Alluding to Rawlsian views about the importance of an overlapping consensus, Wolff explains that philosophy can hope to affect policy only in ways limited by some concession to the status quo and the need to reach consensus. But, says Wolff, this does not stop philosophical reasoning from providing a valuable "argumentative intervention" (8) into policy debates.

The book's aims and methodology should not give the impression that Wolff takes no notice of work done in the pursuit of pure philosophical inquiry, or that theoretical questions are completely set aside. To the contrary, each chapter includes some sort of overview of relevant philosophical theory, which is then connected with various proposals for shaping policy. Each of the chapters that are focused on some discrete policy issue ends with a helpful summary of what the policy upshot might be, in light of the philosophical argument dealt with in that chapter. Wolff also ventures philosophical views of his own, although the level of commitment varies somewhat across the chapters (Wolff's most committed views can be found, I would suggest, in the chapters on punishment and on the free market).

Wolff's book is certainly intended for pedagogical purposes. The description on the back cover presents the book as "an ideal introduction for those coming to philosophy, ethics, or public policy for the first time". It is certainly fair to say that the book justifies this description (while, for that matter, also having something to offer for those who are already familiar with the ethical issues that are discussed). Evidently the intention is that the book is not being offered purely as a textbook for philosophy undergraduates. Wolff himself says the book is intended for a "diverse audience . . . including those in policy" (10). Since many readers of this review will be interested in the book's suitability for a role in the philosophical classroom, I shall remark upon this aspect of its pedagogical credentials, albeit perhaps at the expense of obscuring its wider versatility.

Prior to reading this book, I had some expectation that its scope might turn out to approximate that of a practical ethics textbook. On reflection, however, this is possibly not the sort of book that one would assign (alone) for a class in mainstream practical ethics. This comment is not meant to identify any shortcoming of the book as such. Rather, it is perhaps simply a consequence of the book's devotion to establishing conclusions that are workable from a public-policy perspective. In pursuit of this end, Wolff has drawn on the policy-making experience that he has actually gained, which is perhaps not coextensive with the range of topics that a typical course in practical ethics might address. Indeed, the book offers no treatment of abortion, euthanasia, eating (as opposed to experimenting on) animals, poverty and famine, or other mainstays of classes in practical ethics. Probably the book would be best put to use in any class that aims to equip students with some ability to work in policy-making itself, or in related professions. The book's length (nine chapters of around 20 pages) means it could fit within most semester-length classes. Since the chapters are not excessively long, the book could be studied alongside some additional reading material.

Given his account of the sorts of norms and incentives characteristic of the philosophical profession, Wolff would probably expect any professional philosopher to express some critical sentiments about his book. In the spirit of this assessment, I will venture a few minor objections.

A book with wide scope and short length has to be somewhat selective about which views are selected for extended discussion. Perhaps inevitably, some philosophical solutions to the problems Wolff discusses are given quite short shrift. One example is the broadly Kantian view that mistreatment of animals is wrong because it cultivates elements of bad character, or demeans persons who do it. Wolff dismissed this approach rather quickly (19), which was a little disappointing. Perhaps the Kantian view may not bear much on Wolff's principal question of whether we may experiment on animals when pursuing scientific goals. However, some focus on personal character begins to look well-motivated when we ask whether it is right to legislate against such things as killing animals for sport -- a question that is outside the scope of Wolff's chapter, but which has nevertheless loomed large in British policy debates during the last decade or two. By rejecting approaches that look beyond the moral status of animals as such, Wolff perhaps obscures an important way in which moral philosophy may bear on animal policy more generally.

In addition, at least one general approach to ethically complex policy decisions is largely left out of this book. An idea that has recently begun to gain the attention of philosophers, and has certainly begun to influence policy in the United States, is the brand of so-called libertarian paternalism. It is particularly aimed at getting people to make better choices not by coercing them, but by 'nudging' them in ways that present choices to people in a certain way, without making certain options harder to select. Whatever the merits of this view, it rests on methodological principles that resemble Wolff's. However, libertarian paternalism is mentioned only once, in the chapter on health (141). It might have deserved greater inclusion, particularly in the chapters on gambling and drugs, where Wolff provides an extensive discussion of more traditional ideas about paternalism. If nothing else, Wolff could have used the sections on further reading as a place to indicate where a reader might find out more about views that received limited attention in the main body of the book.

One occasionally feels inclined to quibble with some of the conclusions Wolff draws. The excellent chapter on safety includes some discussion of cost-benefit analysis (Wolff calls this "consequentialism"). This approach involves attaching a monetary value to the prevention of a (statistical) fatality, which is then weighed against the cost of achieving that prevention. One of Wolff's case studies concerns the installation of automatic doors in British commuter trains. These replaced manual doors, which could be opened while the train was in motion, occasionally causing a fatality when a passenger fell out (prematurely-opened doors were also known to strike people standing in stations, often with fatal results). As a matter of fact, a good deal of money was spent on replacing manually-operated doors with automatic ones, which lock while a train is moving. Wolff suggests that a consequentialist approach to railway safety would have recommended against this decision: the cost of installing automatic doors is simply greater than the monetary value of the total number of statistical lives that are saved (101). It is hard to believe, however, that there were not additional advantages gained by the adoption of this policy. For one thing, automatic doors may be decisive in making train-travel a realistic option for persons with disabilities. Generalising, one would think that policy-makers who rely on cost-benefit analysis do not just look at fatality-prevention when using this method of assessing policy outcomes. I was therefore left wondering whether Wolff had made cost-benefit analysis look less plausible than it might actually be.

Finally, there are perhaps some issues of public policy that the book overlooks entirely. Wolff rightly draws attention to the fact that most societies legalise the consumption of tobacco and alcohol while imposing harsh penalties on the use of other recreational drugs that are actually less harmful. Wolff seems to conclude that it is a "mystery" as to why societies do not regulate drug use in accordance with the harm caused (62). However, one might point out that the production of these drugs is carried out by large, well-resourced industries that can exercise substantial lobbying power. The influence of big business provides at least one candidate explanation of why societies typically don't impose the strict controls on alcohol and tobacco that are usually imposed on drugs like cannabis. A more general point here is that perhaps a book on ethics and public policy ought to include some discussion of the regulation of corporate power. Certainly one would expect there to be some policy debate about whether to impose limits on political campaign spending, taxpayer-funded bailouts, and other morally interesting questions that arise in relation to the activities of large businesses (the chapter on free markets does touch on some related themes, but is more focused on what kinds of goods ought to be bought and sold, rather than the power gained by corporations through market activity more generally). Having said that, Wolff's enterprise is largely about bringing to bear his own experience in policy development, and this is already extensively impressive for someone also employed as a full-time philosopher.

Let me repeat that these criticisms are fairly minor and do not substantially bring down the work's overall quality. Wolff's book will benefit anyone (student or professional) who wants to know more about how good moral philosophy can make a valuable contribution to decisions about public policy. It is worth remembering that Wolff's objectives are ones that we all have a stake in (if not as philosophers, then at least as potential victims of bad policy-making). Wolff is to be applauded for making a valuable contribution to progress in such important areas.