Ethics and Qualities of Life

Placeholder book cover

Joel J. Kupperman, Ethics and Qualities of Life, Oxford University Press, 2007, 198pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195308198.

Reviewed by Christian Miller, Wake Forest University


Joel Kupperman's latest book is a wide ranging discussion of many of the leading issues in contemporary ethical theory. Its main aim is to advance a view which he calls "multi-level indirect consequentialism" as a viable alternative to traditional act and rule consequentialist positions. Such a view purports to secure many of the agent-centered constraints and options which are familiar from ordinary morality, as well as to take seriously considerations of fairness and respect for persons. Needless to say, Kupperman's project is ambitious, and his book provides us with a preliminary sketch of the proposal. In what follows, I first summarize the two parts of Ethics and Qualities of Life and then offer some critical remarks.

Summary of Part One

Part one of Kupperman's book is entitled "Factors in Ethical Judgment," and is intended to remind us of the complexity involved in ethical thought as well as the impact of various features of the contexts in which such judgments might be made. Some of the central concepts Kupperman appeals to are the following:

Dislocations: These are one or more events which can disrupt the pattern of someone's life or evoke the consideration of an important issue (15). An example of a dislocation is a difficult moral case such as the trolley problem, along with more familiar events like adapting to a new kind of life, wrestling with divorce or retirement, or confronting a new culture (15).

Construals: The way we construe morally relevant situations can be a highly complicated matter. First, there is a psychological trigger mechanism which, when activated, can signal to the agent that there are morally relevant features in the current situation. This in turn can lead to the application of the agent's normative ideas to these relevant features (24). Needless to say, both aspects of the construal process are highly subjective, and can lead agents to interpret the same situation in different moral terms (28).

Valencing: After a feature of a situation is construed a certain way, it can be valenced, which involves "the sense of something that is happening or may happen as positive in a rewarding way, or negative in a way that is the opposite of rewarding, or perhaps as not mattering one way or the other" (29). Valencing in turn typically influences choice, especially, Kupperman thinks, if what is positively valenced in some way benefits the agent. Indeed, he argues that there needs to be some connection between self-interest and moral norms as otherwise morality would cease to have a grip on our lives (33).

Character: A character trait is a "pronounced tendency to behave in a certain way or ways in certain kinds of situation" (55). In situations in which there is no uniform behavior exhibited by human beings, it is reasonable to cite an agent's character as a partial cause for why she acted the way she did. Such traits are typically narrow rather than broad, i.e., they exhibit stability in the same kind of situation, but are usually not cross-situationally consistent. Thus someone might be disposed to tell the truth to a spouse but not to colleagues at work (56). Kupperman proceeds to give several arguments for why character should itself be a factor in our choices. One is that our choices can shape our future characters (59). Another, more interesting argument points to the role that attitudes and style can have in enhancing personal relationships, thereby enhancing the quality of a person's life. Maintaining a certain style of behavior can itself become an important factor in deliberation (63).

Kupperman concludes part one with some remarks on morality and the need for ethical theory. Moral judgments involve implicit conceptual implications about what the entire society or subculture should think about the matter (67). And morality was "invented" as a means of protection for a society or individual against harm (70). In other words, one of the primary functions of morality is to maintain protections of various kinds for agents. Given this function, we would expect morality to include various prohibitions against, for instance, killing, rape, and theft. These prohibitions allow us to "discern a near-universal core of morality" (71). And this core morality functions best when stated in terms of general rules, rather than impractical lists of judgments about individual cases (71). However, while these rules are at the core of morality, they do not capture all of the moral, and indeed there may be indeterminacy in some cases (78).

Finally, Kupperman argues for the importance of developing an ethical theory. It is a commonplace that our intuitions about morality can be highly divergent and culturally influenced. We might be tempted to appeal to certain core notions of sympathy, fairness, or respect for persons to serve as a check on our intuitive judgments. But Kupperman argues at length that each of these notions is subject to numerous interpretations and, without an underlying ethical theory, will leave us with a host of questions about how to understand and apply it (83-93).

Summary of Part Two

In the second half of Ethics and Qualities of Life, Kupperman turns to the task of providing an initial sketch of such a theory. I was not always clear how the various pieces of the theory are meant to fit together, so let me simply summarize some of his main claims:

One: There is no one basis for ethical judgments. Rather, considerations of fairness, respect for persons, and sympathy are all independent foundations (97-110). In the process, then, it will be necessary to reject act consequentialism, and this is done primarily on the basis of our inability to know the future consequences of our actions (102-7).

Two: Similarly, contractualism cannot tell us the whole story about ethics. As Kupperman writes, "a necessary base of any acceptable moral judgment is that it can play a part in an acceptable moral order, and … what counts as an acceptable moral order cannot be accounted for in purely contractualist terms" (111). In particular, a plausible account of what "reasonable" people can agree to will appeal to consequentialist considerations about human needs and purposes (121-2).

Three: Despite the first claim, consequentialist considerations end up having "special importance," and the heart of Kupperman's positive proposal, multi-level indirect consequentialism, is stated as follows (123-4):

LC1. If what would have the best consequences is not the best thing for X to do, there must be a reason.

LC2. There are constraints, depending on the seriousness of what is at stake, on what can count as a reason for X's not doing what would have the best consequences.

LC3. The only possible reason for not doing what would have the best consequences would be one that appeals to systems of attitudes, habits of mind, and/or policies (of which morality is one) that themselves promote important values (most of which can be put under the heading of human flourishing). These systems themselves are open to question, and it counts against any one of them in its present form if its existence (as prevalent in a society) is not for the best.

On this view, a judgment can be assigned not only a "consequences rating," but also a rating in terms of its bearing on systems of attitudes, habits of mind, or policies, and both ratings factor into the correctness of a judgment or the rightness of an action (129).[1] Kupperman goes on to argue that the above proposal does not collapse into either act or rule consequentialism. Furthermore, LC3 in particular provides a consequentialist justification for agent-centered restrictions and options, and permits attitudes and policies stemming from one's family, friends, and other local relationships (135-9). Finally, among the attitudes and policies which promote important values are traditionally non-consequentialist ones pertaining to fairness and respect for persons, since they can be given a consequentialist justification (139).

Four: There is no plausible "calculus of values," and axiological views such as hedonism or preference satisfactionism are implausible (151-2). A positive view will have to be much more complicated and unsystematic than standard axiological positions have been, and such a view receives little development in this book.

Critical Remarks

Ethics and Qualities of Life is a unique work in philosophical ethics. Rather than focusing on a handful of related ethical issues, it weighs in on what seems to be the entire range of topics in normative theory ranging from the plausibility of the various traditional theories to the priority of the good over the right, the function and origin of morality, the universalizability and formation of moral judgments, and the existence of character traits. It presupposes very little familiarity with the contemporary literature, and could serve as a helpful way of introducing undergraduate majors, for instance, to the leading theoretical issues in ethics which are being discussed today.

At the same time, this stylistic approach also comes with certain predictable concerns. One is that there is often very little detailed engagement with the recent ethical literature. For instance, when mentioning the unity of the virtues thesis, Kupperman writes that "Twentieth-century psychological research revealed what common sense should have known all along, that this thesis is preposterous …" (54). I am no proponent of the thesis myself, but any serious treatment of it should at least involve some discussion of the rather nuanced and sophisticated proposals that have been made in the virtue ethics literature in recent years.[2] Similarly, Kupperman spends several pages critically discussing contractualism, but does not engage at all with Scanlon's view in What We Owe to Each Other. And similar striking absences show up in his critical discussion of hedonism, rule consequentialism, and act consequentialism. As a result, one comes away thinking that Kupperman has raised important initial concerns about these positions, but concerns that contemporary advocates of the views in question are well aware of and have addressed in often painstaking detail.

Another disadvantage of trying to engage with such a broad range of ethical issues, especially in a book of less than two hundred pages, is that it is hard to say anything new. Admittedly, the initial sketch of a version of indirect consequentialism in chapter nine is worth some attention, and I hope that Kupperman will continue to develop it at greater length. But significant parts of the remaining text may strike many readers as very familiar. For example, it is not clear that we really needed an entire chapter (eleven) on the fact that Kantian and consequentialist views have changed over time. Apparently some "very accomplished philosophers" think of the leading ethical theories as "single unchanging entit[ies]" (154). But I doubt that the falsity of such a view is likely to be news to anyone. Similarly, one of the main goals of part one is to attack what is supposed to be the "widely held view" that

doing the right thing is largely a matter of following the dictates of an acceptable moral code, and … it is generally very clear how this code applies to the situations we confront. It also assumes that our society has arrived at an acceptable moral code, so that except for minor or peripheral matters, there is no room for further progress in moral thought. (23)

But surely we already knew that this cannot be a plausible view, and of course we need to take seriously the role of construals, valencing, and character in understanding why, as a matter of fact, an agent arrives at the normative judgments, moral or otherwise, that he does. Indeed, I cannot think of a single contemporary philosopher who has advocated something like the above view in print, and Kupperman himself does not cite one.

Let me conclude this section with two more specific critical remarks. The first has to do with Kupperman's discussion of character traits. Kupperman claims that character traits are typically narrow or local rather than broad or global, i.e., are iteratively stable in similar situations but not cross-situationally consistent. It seems that he simply asserts rather than argues for this view, but in any event its real interest comes when we turn to virtuous traits and recent arguments by Gilbert Harman and John Doris which draw on experimental results in social psychology. Here Kupperman argues for two conclusions. One is that what experiments like the Milgram shock experiment or Stanford prison experiment show is that "in difficult, dangerous, or disorienting circumstances, a great many people (perhaps in some cases most people) will make choices that most of us would judge morally wrong" (188). This may be true as far as what these particular studies show, but a further examination of the experimental literature reveals how even in more familiar situations, a slight change in certain environmental variables will lead to dramatic differences in, for instance, helping behavior. Thus the smell of freshly baked cookies can dramatically increase the rate at which people make change for a dollar, and being told that they performed well on an anagram test can double the rate at which subjects volunteer to help the American Cancer Society or Little League Baseball as compared to controls.[3] So the significance of these results extends much more broadly than just "difficult" circumstances.

Kupperman's second conclusion is to concede that most people do not have global character traits, but to insist that this is compatible with a few people instantiating them, as well as with the more frequent possession of local rather than global traits (188). But this is hardly news -- indeed, Doris himself has repeatedly said the exact same things,[4] and even a charitable reading of Harman's initial papers has him only denying global rather than local traits. Thus far from arguing against these philosophers (as Kupperman seems to take himself to be doing), he is in fact arriving at the very same conclusions they did. But, and here is where I part ways with all three philosophers, it is not obvious that the experimental results are incompatible with the widespread possession of global character traits, so long as these traits are understood in a way which differs from traditional virtue ethics. I cannot possibly argue for this claim here, and have done so at length elsewhere.[5] There I have suggested that, for instance, the relevant social psychology studies are compatible with the existence of a global trait associated with helping behavior which, when suitably triggered, reliably and cross-situationally fosters such actions. Such triggers include, among others, good moods, certain bad moods, guilt, embarrassment, and empathy. Subjects in such states of mind have shown remarkably increased helping behavior over controls, and the same pattern emerges in a range of different situations. The important point for our purposes here about Kupperman's second conclusion is that (i) it is already extremely familiar in the relevant literature, and (ii) a more detailed examination of the issues might have raised doubts about whether it is really warranted in the first place.

The second set of critical remarks concerns Kupperman's indirect consequentialism (IC) as expressed in LC1-3. The obvious concern, and one about which Kupperman himself is well-aware, is that it seems to be incredibly difficult to practically employ the view in determining what actions to perform. For one thing, Kupperman says very little about either what count as good or bad consequences, or about how to make value comparisons. But suppose he can come up with a separate axiological theory to go along with IC. If IC is intended to be not just a standard of right action but also a decision procedure, then how can we expect ordinary agents to employ it in a reliable manner? First of all LC1 would seem to inherit all the same epistemic difficulties as Kupperman raised in rejecting act consequentialism, so it is hard to see how it can be an improvement on such grounds over that view. But furthermore, LC3 introduces a host of epistemic challenges in its own right. For agents would have to compare the "consequences rating" of a given judgment with its rating in relation to good attitudes, habits of mind, and policies.[6] And Kupperman readily acknowledges that it is often incredibly hard to gauge accurately what this second rating should be, at least until we have a chance to look back and see what effects a change in policy has had. Overall, then, Kupperman complains about act consequentialism that it fails to meet the standard whereby "[o]ur ordinary discourse about what is right and wrong has features that require that we often be able, at the time, to say what is right and what is wrong" (104, emphasis mine). But then why does not IC fail this standard even more dramatically?

Kupperman does admit that IC is better suited for justifying and criticizing an existing moral order rather than for discovering a new one (166, 168). But then it is not clear why the act consequentialist could not get off the hook for the same reason. And in any event, we would then need a separate story about how to discover a better moral order or a correct moral judgment. Kupperman rightly notes that when a policy would, for instance, foster immediately obvious negative consequences like murder or assault, it is not hard to figure out how to proceed. Unfortunately, though, it is far from obvious what the policy implications would be in both the short and long runs when it comes to many contested moral issues.

At several points, Kupperman considers whether the work of discovery might be done by our intuitive conceptions of such things as fairness or respect for persons, and notes that historically these intuitions, rather than estimates of consequences, "have done most of the work in the major moral transformations of the last several hundred years" (145, 180). But, as Kupperman observes, he cannot be content to simply fall back on these intuitions. For in part one, he argued at length that conceptions of fairness and respect for persons are subject to numerous interpretations and are highly contestable. And so for him, "a reasonable test of any idea of fairness is its consequences: whether it makes things better or worse" (180). But then we are right back to the same epistemic difficulties again.

So my hope is that in future work Kupperman will develop IC at much greater length and explain in more detail how moral agents should go about making correct moral decisions.


I do not want to end this review on a negative note, as there is much to like about Kupperman's book. He has presented us with a host of issues in a way that highlights how important and interesting they really are. Furthermore, he has offered a number of remarks and proposals concerning these issues which merit further consideration. Finally, Kupperman has sketched the outlines of a normative theory that, once developed in greater detail, has the potential to be both original and influential.

[1] Kupperman also discusses at length a third, "illocutionary" rating, which asks whether a person's judgment, as well as our agreement with it, would in the particular circumstances have good or bad consequences (129).

[2] See, e.g., J. L. Ackrill, Aristotle the Philosopher, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981, pg. 137, Gary Watson, "Virtues in Excess," Philosophical Studies 46 (1984): 57-74, and Jonathan Jacobs and Jonathan Zeis, "The Unity of the Vices," The Thomist (1990): 641-653.

[3] See, respectively, Robert Baron, "The Sweet Smell of … Helping: Effects of Pleasant Ambient Fragrance on Prosocial Behavior in Shopping Malls," Personality and Social Psychology Bulletin 23 (1997): 498-503 and J. Weyant, "Effects of Mood States, Costs, and Benefits on Helping," Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 36 (1978): 1169-1176. For much further discussion, see my "Social Psychology, Mood, and Helping: Mixed Results for Virtue Ethics," under review.

[4] See, e.g., Doris' Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003, pg. 23, 25, 60, 64-5.

[5] See the paper mentioned in note three as well as my "Empathy, Social Psychology, and Global Helping Traits," Philosophical Studies (forthcoming).

[6] Not to mention the illocutionary rating as well that was noted in footnote one.