Ethics and Social Survival

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Milton Fisk, Ethics and Social Survival, Routledge, 2016, 236pp., $119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138646551.

Reviewed by Tim Mulgan, University of Auckland and University of St Andrews


In this fascinating and provocative book, Milton Fisk defends a radical and original account of the nature, basis, and justification of ethics. Ethical life is a project, whose goal is to avoid social collapse, or more positively, to ensure social viability. What matters is neither the survival of any particular social arrangement, government, or state, nor the mere existence of human beings, but rather the continuation of some human society where ethical norms make sense. Examples of social collapse include: Germany in 1945 (25), and "what remained after the US Army's destruction of Native American society, after Stalin's destruction of kulak society in the Ukraine, after the Khmer Rouge slaughters in Cambodia, or after the rampages in Darfur" (59).

Almost everyone will agree that social viability is important, and for most people it is a very significant, and possibly even over-riding, ethical value. But Fisk goes further. The imperative to preserve social viability is not just one ethical norm, even a supreme one. Social viability is not an ethical value at all, but instead an external and necessary precondition for its possibility. Social viability is the goal of ethical life -- the standard against which all ethical norms are judged. Everything else derives its value from its contribution to social viability. And that contribution depends on the circumstances. What threats does society face here and now? What kinds of collapse are possible for us? How can they be averted? Ethics is thus contingent. Norms that would be valid in one situation may be pointless or pernicious in another. Ethics is also essentially contested. People will always reasonably disagree about what best serves social viability, and therefore about ethical norms. Because rigid conformity to dominant values can leave a society open to new threats of collapse, ethical life itself favours disagreement about ethical norms!

The book is in three parts: Basics, Alternatives, and Extensions. Part I sets out Fisk's theory of ethics. Ethical life is not one form of life among many, but instead "the ultimate arbiter for all [forms of life]" (3), providing a forum where competing ethical claims can be compared: "If the entrepreneur's concern about competitive markets conflicts with the environmentalist's concern about impacts on nature, then they can develop their disagreement within the context of a shared agreement about the goal of ethical life." (6)

Ethical life is a project. Every project has a goal. Social viability is the most plausible goal. We judge something as wrong when "reliance on [that] type of action . . . poses a threat of social collapse" (7). Ethical norms help to manage that threat, providing "assurances that we can get on with our lives, despite our differences, without constant suspicion." (9)

To demonstrate that ethical norms only make sense within the project of ethical life, Fisk asks us how we might respond to imminent social collapse:

In desperation, one might say that ethical norms will hold even when the project of ethical life weakens. But imagine that the conditions have changed so much that selfishness overwhelms the sentiments that motivate a project of ethical life. The order of the day then becomes lack of respect for others, power grabbing, and refusal to cooperate. In these circumstances, no ethical project exists within which a discussion of norms can take place. (15)

Because human beings are not "ethical robots" (21), our ethical life motivation must be grounded in some emotion. Drawing on Mill and Kant, Fisk identifies the necessary emotion as fidelity to society: "a sentiment promoting support for social existence understood as a network of trust, solidarity, and joyous interaction." (23) The ethical person is loyal to human society per se, not to any particular social arrangement: "periodic change to avoid collapse is preferable to a blind fidelity that refuses change." (25)

If we recognise multiple ethical sources, the resulting conflict threatens social collapse. Social viability must therefore be the only source of ethical norms. Fortunately, social viability can deliver "all one needs for a valid ethics of the self as well as for one of special relations." (56) For instance, we do need norms of authenticity because society will not get the critics it needs if "journalists and teachers avoid seeking the truth for fear of what might happen to them" (57); we don't need a separate animal ethic because human societies normally "also contain animals" (60); and we do need norms governing "affirmative action and minority autonomy" (61) -- though only so long as they promote social viability.

Part II compares Fisk's ethical theory with several contemporary alternatives: religion, freedom, reason, democracy, and transcendence.

Fisk argues that religious ethics has social viability as its underlying goal, because a "God who is not heinous, capricious, or vengeful would command what serves the human interest in living together." (92) This is especially true in a modern pluralist society, where even those whose ethical beliefs are based on faith, "must still win the debate on why that belief is better for realizing the common good." (95-6)

Fisk's example of a reason-based ethic is Scanlon's analysis of what we owe to each other in terms of principles that no one can reasonably reject. Fisk argues that, to resolve inevitable disagreements about what is reasonable, Scanlon must introduce a teleological element, where "the right thing to do is to act in ways others could not reject on grounds of incompatibility with social viability." (123)

Freedom, especially the freedom to resist, "plays a crucial role in correcting tendencies toward social collapse". (109) But the liberal goal of a free society cannot replace social viability, because some important ethical norms "neither support nor weaken a free society." (99) In particular, norms of "solidarity", such as the obligation to feed the starving, "serve to keep us together. [But] they restrict freedom and hence fail to promote a free society, which abhors encroachment." (103) Fisk argues that he is in agreement with John Rawls that, while "liberty has primacy at the level of norms, social survival has primacy as a project." (111)

Like freedom, democracy is only an ethical value when it promotes social viability. It does this often, but not always. For instance, Fisk observes that democracy led to civic strife in late-medieval Italy, and he endorses Mill's suggestion that universal suffrage may only be appropriate once universal education and full employment were in place.

Against the objection that ethics should transcend society, Fisk defends "an immanent criticism [that] . . . appeals to the society's own survival in criticizing it for harbouring destructive tendencies." (149) Fisk gives two examples:

the gradual process of enlightenment [in much of Europe] that led away from a social life centred on authority and hierarchy . . . [and] the short-lived glasnost years in the Soviet Union [where] control from the centre of the society had it on a course to self-destruction. (151)

Part III explores various possible extensions of Fisk's ethical theory. He first distinguishes responsive values (which address the concerns of others) from acquisitive values (which address an individual's own concerns). One characteristic of modern society is the conviction, which Fisk does not dispute, that a market founded on acquisitive values is necessary to guarantee the basics of social life. Modern ethical life is thus a constant struggle between the unlimited acquisitive values of the market, and the regulation needed to make those values compatible with responsive values and social viability.

We also need social viability to balance competing notions of justice, especially when we must decide which common goods to pursue or which rights to prioritise. In particular, if social survival demands new common goods, then a commitment to existing ethical life may itself threaten social viability.

In his final chapter, Fisk confronts a challenge to his theory. If the goal of ethical life is the preservation of society, then a truly global ethic requires a global society. As no such society exists, it appears that Fisk cannot accommodate a truly global ethic. Yet such an ethic seems essential. "Without the existence of a global society supporting measures of climate control, we cannot say that there is ethical validation for a universal struggle against global warming." (230) Fisk the environmental activist would clearly regard this as an unacceptable feature of any ethical theory!

Fisk offers two main replies. First, as inter-societal contacts increase, talk about a truly global society may become plausible. Second, individual societies frustrated by precarious modi vivendi may attempt to form "an overarching society that can organize more comprehensive ways to avoid conflicts." (225) The viability of individual societies will depend on this "society of societies" (226), which might involve a federation ethics, or even at the limit a global ethic.

Fisk's approach is thought-provoking and challenging, especially for many schools of contemporary ethics. Anyone interested in contemporary ethics, and its relation to political activism, will find much to ponder in this very readable book. I close with three general concerns.

First, can there ever be reasonable disagreement about whether the price of social viability is ethically permissible? Imagine a broken future where resources become so scarce that social survival demands oppressive social control, lotteries on basic necessities, or even the culling of human populations. Could ethical life demand such sacrifices? In his discussion of religious ethics, Fisk admits that a religious ethics "may have some norms that we cannot make credible by testing their social consequences." (96) Could the same also hold true, in extremis, for secular ethics? Fisk argues that, if life becomes too bleak, ethical life becomes impossible. But we might hope instead that moral philosophy would guide us through such grim possible futures, rather than abandoning us to a Hobbesian war of all against all.

A related worry is whether, in extreme cases, Fisk's social viability ethic can provide sufficient protection for the interests, rights, and freedoms of individuals. Fisk argues that obligations and rights are essential features of ethical life, because solidarity and trust are necessary to any viable society, and they will break down unless we are all prepared to come to the aid of those who are suffering. But one might reasonably wonder whether this contingent connection will deliver sufficiently robust rights? Can we really be confident that every intuitively compelling class of violations of individual rights has a negative impact on social viability?

Finally, like any deflationary account of ethical life, Fisk faces a motivational challenge. If we came to regard ethical life as (merely) a vehicle for social viability, would we still take ethical life sufficiently seriously? Or does social viability itself demand a (false) belief in a transcendent standard? As the sacrifices individuals must bear to avoid social collapse become more urgent, or if ethical norms protect a global society whose connection to particular individuals is very thin, this motivational gap may become ever more problematic.