Ethics and the A Priori

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Michael Smith, Ethics and the A Priori, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 400pp, $32.99 (pbk) ISBN 0521007739

Reviewed by Simon Kirchin, University of Kent


Michael Smith has been one of the most influential figures in moral philosophy during the past fifteen or so years. As well as producing The Moral Problem, Smith has written a large number of widely read papers. These works form a significant contribution to, and reflection of, the concerns that have been at the forefront of debate in recent times. Although much of his work has been in moral philosophy, his writings have been concerned with philosophy of language, metaphysics, philosophical psychology and beyond.

In Ethics and the A Priori (hereafter 'EAP'), Smith has collected seventeen essays and grouped them under two headings -- 'Moral Psychology' and 'Meta-Ethics' -- whilst also providing an introduction that shows the connections between them. Throughout, as readers familiar with Smith's work will expect, we have writing that is accessible and engaging. Smith shows clearly what the debates are and gives one a (correct) sense that key thoughts and worries are being discussed. It (almost) goes without saying that it is valuable to have these papers collected in one place.

For those readers unfamiliar with Smith's views, let me summarize much of his thinking. Smith marks a difference between what he calls 'normative reasons' and 'motivating reasons', indicating the two ways in which we might speak of someone having a 'reason for action'. We might say that Eric had a reason to eat the cake and be indicating only that Eric had some desire -- some motivation -- to eat and that he thought that cake was something that would satisfy his hunger. Alternatively, we might say that Eric had no reason to eat the cake since he had no justification for doing so; perhaps he needs to lose weight. Smith believes that motivating reasons, which are psychological states, are constituted by pairs of desires and means-ends beliefs and so defends a neo-Humean position. On the other hand, normative reasons for Smith are "propositions whose truth would justify acting in a certain way: they are (roughly speaking) facts about the desirability of so acting" (p. 2). In the first part of EAP Smith details how to characterize both sorts of reason and devotes much of his energy to articulating the relationship between them. In essence he argues that normative reasons are to be understood in terms of idealized desires. Smith is explicit in how this idea links moral psychology with his metaethical position, for (roughly) what we have normative reason to do is simply a function of what it would be good and desirable to do, where this is understood in terms of what we would desire to do if we were fully rational. Hence, he defends a type of dispositional theory of value. Arguably, it is what he says in linking moral psychology with metaethics that has made him so influential.

A discussion of every paper is beyond this review. What I do now is discuss one key paper -- 'Internal Reasons', first published in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (1995) -- that captures much of his overall position.

Smith thinks that Bernard Williams was correct when he claimed that no external reasons statements are true and that the only (normative) reasons that exist are 'internal reasons'. (Williams (1981).) In other words, what we have normative reason to do must in some way be linked to our subjective motivational set (our 'S'), which contains our desires, commitments, and the like. In the absence of feeling any motivation to act, it is impossible, think internalists, to see how there could exist any normative reason to act in any plausible sense of this term. However, Smith introduces one important difference and one key clarification. First, the clarification. Williams believes that one's normative reasons are based on what desires one would have if one had access to all the relevant information and one had thought hard about one's present S and imagined having different desires, but where, the implication is, we assume that such imagination does not continue indefinitely and the end result will be someone who is recognizably us. Smith summarizes this as 'one has normative reason to Φ if and only if one's fully rational self would desire to Φ'. Smith considers two ways of interpreting the clause concerning idealized desires. According to the example model one has a reason to Φ if and only if one's fully rational self would desire that one's fully rational self Φ-ed and, hence, sets an example for one to follow. According to the advice model one has a normative reason to Φ if and only if one's fully rational self would advise one to Φ. Smith argues that the example model is wrong by adapting an example from Gary Watson. (Watson (1975).) Imagine that one loses badly at squash and one is so angry and frustrated that all one wants to do is to hit one's opponent. There is no normative reason to do this, and we can assume that if one were fully rational one would not wish to do so. Let us suppose that, if one were fully rational and calm, one would have (most) reason to walk over and shake the opponent's hand. This is what the example model tells us we should do (through showing us by example) thinks Smith, yet it is surely wrong. It is wrong since, because I am not calm like my fully rational self, if I were to walk over I might still be tempted to hit my opponent. What motivation could the example model engender in me? What I have most reason to do, given I am angry, is to walk towards the locker room and calm down, and this is something my fully rational self would advise me to do.

Having added to Williams' account, Smith introduces a difference. Williams is clearly right, he thinks, in saying that imagination is important in producing new desires, destroying existing ones, and getting us to see what lives we could lead beyond our present S. But Williams is wrong to concentrate exclusively on imagination. It is just as common a phenomenon that when we deliberate we do not simply imagine what our new lives could be, but also attempt to have a systematically justifiable set of desires. If this is right, thinks Smith, it results in two important ideas. First, he plausibly speculates that having gone through a process of deliberation where one tries to have a coherent and unified set of desires, one may believe that such a set is systematically unified and, because of that, more rational to hold. In which case, this belief might lead to a desire, namely a desire that one's set of desires be acted upon. It may also lead to other beliefs, such as the belief that one should discard certain desires if they seem out of place and ad hoc. This first idea is important since we can now fill in the supposed 'missing link' in Hume's account of psychology. Hume's account, taken at face value, results in a mystery since for him beliefs and desires have independent existences; the presence of an example of one of the two need not mean that an example of the other is present. Yet, people often deliberate to decide what to do, and when they decide what to do they form a corresponding desire. Smith has a ready explanation of this phenomenon. If I believe that it would be rational for me to desire to Φ in circumstances C, and I believe that I am in C, and I have an overall desire to have a rational and coherent psychology, then surely the only rational thing for me to do is to desire to Φ. A psychology that includes both a belief that Φ-ing is rationally desirable and a desire to Φ is surely more coherent than other options, such as believing Φ-ing to be rationally desirable yet remaining indifferent towards it.

The second important idea is that, whereas Williams proposes a relativistic account of normative reasons, Smith offers a non-relativistic account. Williams' account is relativistic because it is fairly tightly constrained by the Ss with which individuals start. If different people end up having the same normative reasons this is an accident. Alternatively, Smith thinks that when one is trying to have a systematically unified set of desires one is aiming to have the desires that many or all rational people would arrive at (or want to arrive at) in similar circumstances. In other words, Smith assumes that the normative reasons that apply to rational creatures are largely a function of the desires that they would converge on if they were fully rational. Smith characterizes the debate between him and Williams as a matter of what is meant by 'rational being'. Can you be rational if, when deciding what to do, you do not pay heed to what fellow creatures would do in the same circumstance? Smith argues that natural language supports his view of reasons. We talk of people having reasons per se, not 'reasons-for-Smith' and 'reasons-for-Williams'. The normative force of reasons applies simpliciter. Of course, the individual considerations that apply to people may, because they are different, mean that a reason applies to one but not another. But the very concept of a reason is not relative.

I have three sets of worries with Smith's account. (i) It is not obvious to me that internalists should regard the example model as misguided. Let us return to the squash example. Clearly, as Smith presents it, one has a reason to calm down away from the court. In fact I think we can say that one probably has another reason (which Smith does not mention), namely to be calmer in the future. That one could well have both of these reasons can be explained by thinking about the advice that one's fully rational self might give. We can imagine that such a hypothetical figure could counsel me into seeing the appeal of being calm and walking away, primarily because we can imagine that such a figure will be sensitive to me as I am now and angle his advice accordingly, such that some motivation towards acting in this way will follow.

But, in which case, what is so bad with the example model? First, it cannot be that we have a rational person per se who is, by example, showing one what to do, since we are still imagining that it is one's fully rational self leading by example, a hypothetical figure whose S is in some way similar to one's present S. Indeed, and more generally, the example model cannot be assumed to fail where the advice model is assumed to succeed because, on the former model, the content of one's fully rational self's S will fail to connect with the content of one's S. This cannot be right simply because the fully rational self referred to in both models is the same.

So something else must be happening. At one point Smith suggests that the problem with the example model is that, precisely because she is calm and collected, the fully rational self will not be walking off the court to calm down and so there will be no example to follow. On the other hand, we can imagine that the advice to be calm and collected would always come. But this is unfair. To repeat, there is a constraint built into the example model that the fully rational self will be like oneself. So the idea that this person never gets angry when playing squash, nor throws tantrums, nor fails to see the other person's point of view, and the like, is an idea that leads us away from this constraint and towards a rational self that is not recognizably oneself at all; they are the rational person per se. In order for the example model to qualify prima facie as a model for internalism, this figure has to be close enough to me to qualify as my fully rational self, so presumably even if he does not feel anger, he can sympathize with my feeling angry and set examples accordingly. But is this allowed on Smith's characterization of it? On one, perhaps literal, way of reading it the answer is 'no', for we are just talking about whether the fully rational self would desire for the fully rational self to Φ. There is no reference to setting examples 'angled towards me'. Yet a similar reading of the advice model results in puzzlement as to how I would be moved. If I am angry and frustrated what reason have we to think that some fully rational me that said simply 'You should be more calm and collected' will move me? For the advice model to work as internalists require, we have to assume, as I have assumed, that the advice given will be directed to me with some sympathy for my present S. It is only fair that we make a similar assumption regarding the example model. Simply being all sweetness and light towards one's opponent may not be the sort of example that will engender the best motivation in me. A fully rational, sensitive me who aims to be an example for me might well realize that he needs to show dignified behaviour whilst encouraging me to get out of the danger area as quickly as possible.

This leads to a further thought. Smith assumes the following claim is true: angled advice directed towards an agent and the (first-order) desires and commitments she has now will always motivate her more than an example set by a more perfect version of her. I worry about the truth of this. Perhaps there might be some cases where I see the appeal of Φ-ing because I have listened to sensitive advice rather than seeing some figure like me Φ-ing. But if this is so then it will depend on my S, and the particular circumstances I find myself in, and not be a matter of one model being better per se for all people and their Ss in all circumstances. Perhaps, alternatively, I am the sort of person who, when angry and frustrated at losing at squash, hates being given (what I see as) patronizing advice by some goody two-shoes; perhaps such advice angers me even more. Perhaps I am far more likely to see the appeal of being calm and collected by seeing someone quietly depart the court in a dignified fashion. Or perhaps I am far more likely to shake the anger from my bones if I have a challenge to rise to, such as trying to be the most gracious loser my opponent has played. Perhaps I am the sort of person who only gets motivated in a 'different' direction when I am angry (or bored, or joyous, or grieving, or whatever), when I have the option of doing something that people think is seemingly beyond me. This brings out the real difference between the two models. The difference is not between action and conversation. Rather, it is between being shown, in whatever way, an action that is (supposedly) closer to my present state, and being shown those that are (supposedly) more distant. But, as I hope I have suggested, to assume that the former will always have more likelihood of motivating people, and so be a more acceptable explanation of what happens for internalists, is too much of an assumption. Note that advocates of the advice model cannot claim victory by saying that the advice given will be just the sort of advice that will appeal to the person as they are now, be they needing small or large challenges to rise to. This might be true, but it results in the debate between the two models collapsing.

This debate over models is fuelled by the following thought. 'My fully rational self provides me with advice or example, and such advice or example can ground my normative reasons (according to internalists) only if it appeals to me. So, to what extent is the fully rational self like me?' To my mind, this idea -- particularly the final question -- is also at work in Smith's non-relativism, which I now consider in (ii) and (iii).

(ii) Can non-relativism be combined with internalism? Formally it can, and Smith gives us a very good account of it. Whilst people can still have their idiosyncratic normative reasons, many or all have some normative reasons in common. This, crucially for an internalist, is still based on what every person's -- or every rational person's -- S is like.

I am very sympathetic to Smith's non-relativism, but there are a number of points to make. To begin, recall Williams' original insight. There can be a normative reason for A to Φ in C only if A is or could be motivated to Φ in C. If matters are otherwise, we have lost a plausible conception of 'normativity'. (Note I am not challenging whether Williams is right in this piece.) But, as in (i), in order for Williams' insight concerning possible motivations to make sense -- for us to be talking about A Φ-ing in C -- then the amount of change in A's S has to be limited. In order for Smith to combine internalism with non-relativism we have to be assured that every rational agent really will consider seriously, and care about, how other rational agents would act, and, further, that this will result in an appropriate change in such agents' Ss. Or, at least, we could reasonably imagine that such agents could come to care about such matters and change their Ss. Now, although it is true that many people will think like that (or could, with small persuasion, be brought to think like that), to my mind there is just too much contingency here for Smith to deliver his non-relativism. There are people in this world with Ss such that they do not and will not care what other people will do, nor care about the effects of their actions on others. To imagine that everyone could be brought to care in these ways is to go beyond the original internalist insight; one is stretching the concept of 'reasonably imagine' too far. If this is so, Smith is left with a stark choice: either eschew non-relativism or eschew internalism.

What options are open to an internalist non-relativist to show that matters are not as I suggest? On pain of begging the question against their fellow, but relativistic, internalists, they cannot simply classify as 'irrational' people who fail to consider seriously how others reason. Indeed, it is noticeable that Smith does not pursue this strategy. Instead, he draws on everyday linguistic conventions to argue that the very idea of a normative reason involves such things applying beyond any particular individual. But to my mind there is an awful lot that one can read into such language and debates. When one person is trying to convince another to Φ, perhaps by saying "You have a reason to Φ!", she might be merely trying to exert power over the other and get him to see the world as she does. There may be no legitimate basis for such a claim.

Smith may protest that this is not quite his point. He is arguing that in order for any disagreement to be meaningful there has to be a measure of agreement, and here the agreement has to be over the word 'reason'. Hence his move that we do not debate whether someone has a 'reason-for-Smith' to Φ. Quite so. Yet, a relativistic internalist can argue that there is a way of construing what a reason is that everyone can agree on, but which does not result in every rational agent having the same reason to Φ (excepting reasonable circumstances that stand as reason for exemption). The concept of a reason is just 'that which would motivate an agent as she is now or would motivate her after she (a) had got full information and (b) had undergone a bout of reflection on her present desires and commitments such that she had changed her S but was still recognizably herself'. This gives us a characterization of a reason, and is enough to be debating meaningfully whether A has a reason to Φ, without committing an internalist to non-relativism. Our arguments about whether A has a reason to Φ will focus on A's present S and how it could reasonably change if A imagined different lives for herself in the way that A typically imagines. There need be no mention of what other people would do if A does not care about such things. Again, the debate between relativistic and non-relativistic internalists will hinge on which characterization of actual ethical practice and language is best. It is not clear to me that we should automatically side with the latter camp.

(iii) These thoughts about non-relativism threaten what Smith says about the solution to Hume's missing link. To my mind Smith is right in thinking that it is more coherent to have beliefs and desires that match in the way outlined above. But he argues additionally that internalism (that is, his version of internalism) can explain why this is so, but externalism cannot. We would expect there to be a causal account, in rational creatures at least, linking believing what it is desirable to do and desiring to act in accordance with such beliefs. An externalist, in contrast, does not define normative reasons "in terms of what we would desire if our psychology exhibited maximal coherence and unity. Without inquiring further into what exactly the content of a reason claim on such a conception is we can therefore already see that there is no reason to expect that a psychology which pairs a belief that there is a reason to Φ in circumstances C with a desire to do something other than Φ in C will exhibit less in the way of coherence and unity than a psychology that pairs that belief with the desire to Φ in C. It thus appears that externalists will be unable to explain why it is rational to desire in accordance with our beliefs about the reasons that we have." (EAP. p. 37) In other words, it will be just a fluke, by externalism's lights, if we have beliefs and desires that match, for our belief that there is a normative reason to Φ will in no way relate to what we may desire to do.

I have two comments about this. First, I have argued that Smith's position reaches beyond, and so threatens, the original internalist insight. In which case, whilst it might be true that some people's beliefs and desires will match in the way Smith suggests, for others we might be able to find them both believing that Φ-ing in C is desirable and desiring to Φ in C only if we make some unreasonable assumptions about how much their Ss could change. Secondly, and more pertinent to Smith's criticism, why should an externalist care about what he says? Although it is true that it is nice for anyone if their beliefs and desires match, the force of that only hits home for internalists who assume that there is some essential connection between normativity and motivation in the first place. Or, to put it another way, it becomes important to have desires match beliefs only if one defines normative reason in terms of the rationally desirable or something similar. This is why the apparent flukiness of the match in Hume's account stands out so much. If one is an externalist there is no great worry about whether someone's beliefs about what she should do match her S, for the grounding of her normative reasons has nothing to do with her S. Any problem that arises here is a practical problem for the agent herself who somehow needs to act. Once we see this we can see that externalists can make two separate claims: (a) some of one's normative reasons are not grounded in one's S or an S that one could reasonably have; and (b) as part of their S, some, many or all people wish to have desires to act on the reasons that they think they have. To claim that all people have a desire to act in accordance with their beliefs about what they think they have reason to do is, strictly, consistent with externalism. However, it probably would invite raised eyebrows, both because we might doubt whether it is true, and because, if it is true, we might wonder if the general existence was more than a mere accident and reconsider internalism's merits. ("Perhaps there is some essential link with normativity and being motivated after all.") However, externalists need have no such fear with the weaker formulations. That some or many people have a general desire to desire that they act on the beliefs about what they have normative reason to do does not mean we should automatically adopt internalism. In the end, both the agent, and ourselves, might think that what she has normative reason to do is based on something other than what she is motivated to do, despite her desiring to do what she believes is right.

As mentioned, the ideas discussed play themselves out in many ways in EAP and many of Smith's other writings. Even if one finds the details and the overall vision problematic, there is no denying that Smith advances an attractive position that might prove hard to challenge convincingly. After all, we might not wish to be externalists, nor wish to be relativistic internalists. In which case, is there another general option for us besides the one that Smith articulates so well? Possibly not.

Other References

Smith, Michael (1994) The Moral Problem (Oxford: Basil Blackwell)

Watson, Gary (1975) "Free Agency", reprinted in Gary Watson (ed.) Free Will (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1982), pp. 96-110.

Williams, Bernard (1981) 'Internal and External Reasons', reprinted in Bernard Williams Moral Luck (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), pp. 101-113.