Ethics and the Acquisition of Organs

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T. M. Wilkinson, Ethics and the Acquisition of Organs, Oxford University Press, 2011, 209pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199607860.

Reviewed by Robert M. Veatch, Georgetown University


Acquiring human organs for transplantation poses many philosophically rich ethical issues. T. M. Wilkinson addresses some of these in a sophisticated and philosophically astute manner. He is at his best dealing with the deep, philosophical underpinnings of organ procurement. On the other hand, some in the transplant world might feel he is not in close touch with the problems of the real world of transplant.

After a brief introductory chapter on the shortage of organs and whether that scarcity is unavoidable, Wilkinson devotes three of the remaining nine chapters to basic, preliminary philosophical questions pertaining to whether humans have rights over their bodies, the possibility of posthumous harms, and the moral claims of the dead. Thus Wilkinson sees that it is important to set the moral groundwork, devoting about a third of the book to these basic issues before turning to a few of the most difficult moral issues of organ procurement in the remaining chapters.

The volume is by no means a complete exploration of the ethics of transplantation. Organ transplant ethics is sometimes divided into three main topics: the ethics of procuring organs, the ethics of allocation, and deciding when humans are dead or otherwise candidates for procuring life-prolonging organs (the dead donor rule). Almost nothing is said in this book about the ethics of allocating organs or the problems of the dead donor rule and defining death. Before turning to the questions the author does address so provocatively, a word is necessary about the areas omitted.

By law, at least in the United States, and by common wisdom everywhere, those allocating organs must take into account efficiency (utility) and equity (justice or fairness). Most would also incorporate questions about autonomy and its relevance to allocation. What should happen, for example, when an allocation that will maximize the number of life-years from the organ supply requires giving priority to healthier recipients, one race over another, or one age group over others? Should aggregate life-years be sacrificed to promote equity? Should utility and justice count as equally weighty? When should patients be disqualified as too sick or too healthy to receive an organ? Should high quality organs from young donors be preferentially allocated to young recipients? And if so, should this be done for reasons of utility or reasons of equity? These questions are not addressed.

The definition of death is another critical area not addressed in this small book. Historically, most have accepted the dead donor rule, the rule that patients must be deceased before life-prolonging organs are procured. That assumption has recently been challenged by a small group who would endorse special cases of procurement from some still-living people. It is clear that the need for organs (especially hearts) led to widespread adoption of a brain-based pronouncement of death, but after over forty years it is unclear whether literally every function of the brain must be gone before death is pronounced. A small minority (including some sophisticated analysts) persists in claiming that traditional circulatory or somatic definitions of death are correct, implying that someone could be alive with a dead brain. None of these issues are taken up in the Wilkinson volume.

Even many of the hottest issues in acquiring organs are not addressed. For example, should persons who screen HIV- but who live high-risk lifestyles be candidates for procurement? What about HIV+ donors whose organs could be placed with HIV+ recipients? Should it be acceptable to place an organ from an HIV+ donor in an HIV- recipient in end-stage liver failure whose only alternative is immediate death? What about potential donors with histories of cancer or other potentially transmittable diseases such as hepatitis? Given the organ shortage, could these organs be offered with adequate information to potential recipients?

Although the book is narrowly selective in its topics, the ones it takes on are covered thoroughly and the discussion is more advanced than anything previously existing. The strongest part of the book is in the early chapters where Wilkinson provides the most profound account ever written of why people have a right to control what is done with their bodies after they die. The problem is not as simple as it would seem. Rights theorists often link our rights to valid claims against setbacks in our interests, but dead people cannot be harmed. Why people's views about what happens to them after they die have moral force is not as easy to explain as one might think.

Wilkinson provides a rich and satisfying account drawing on state of the art philosophical literature. In chapter 2 he distinguishes between the right to bodily integrity (the kind of rights that support a patient's right to refuse treatment) and the right to personal sovereignty. Following Joel Feinberg, he grounds his post-mortem rights related to organ acquisition primarily in personal sovereignty.

In chapter 3 he builds a theory of posthumous interests and states the case for why people can have such interests. In the following chapter he shows why these interests should be protected by the right to personal sovereignty. These three chapters cover territory familiar to some philosophers, but those working in applied ethics, especially non-philosophers with a tolerance for very detailed and careful analysis, will find them rewarding. They provide a firm foundation for the more familiar work on several problems of transplantation that follow.

The remaining chapters take up a limited number of the most difficult issues in transplant: the role of the family in authorizing organ procurement from the dead, how we should treat the dead whose wishes about organ procurement are uncertain, conscription of organs, living donation, impartiality and directed donation, and markets in organs (primarily procurement markets).

Wilkinson argues, perhaps surprisingly but persuasively, that within a framework of personal sovereignty the family's authority to decide concerning procurement of a deceased family member's organs is quite limited. Aside from cases in which the deceased has authorized the family to decide, the family's claim must be based on the problematic belief that the family knows best what the deceased would have wanted, the even more problematic claim of authority in its own right, or the controversial claim that the costs of any alternative would be too great. Wilkinson mistakenly believes that actual practice gives the family a veto even in cases in which the deceased has made a first-person donation. At least in the United States, first-person consent has from the beginning been the law even if it was not always followed in practice, and it is now the actual practice in at least many organ procurement organizations. Wilkinson's pragmatic argument that family veto should prevail is controversial, especially if one takes seriously the power of rights grounded in personal sovereignty. Wilkinson does not consider the possibility that at least some cultures give the family unit a sovereignty in its own right that is analogous to personal sovereignty, nor what the implications for such family sovereignty would be for organ procurement, especially procurement from children.

Chapter 6 is in some ways the most controversial of the chapters. It takes up the problem of how society should treat the deceased whose wishes about organ procurement are not clear, but who may well have not objected to organ harvesting. He argues that taking without consent in such cases could be permissible, but that "opt out" policies should be developed for those who, in fact, would object. This chapter is frustrating for its failure to explore adequately whether there is a fundamental lack of parallel between the offense of taking without explicit permission -- a clear violation of personal sovereignty in the case when the deceased had, in fact, developed opposition to organ procurement while alive -- and failing to take when the deceased had, in fact, developed a desire to have organs procured -- a mere harm to posthumous interests that does not violate a right. Surely, no one has a positive right to have one's organs procured even if there has been an explicit donation. Even more obvious is the fact that no positive right to have organs procured exists when the deceased's views are unknown.

Tucked within this debate is a linguistic issue that Wilkinson touches on but does not grasp fully. Policies of taking organs of the deceased in cases of uncertainty over the deceased's wishes are called by two names: presumed consent and routine procurement with opt-out (originally called "routine salvaging"). Although the terms are often used interchangeably, there are important differences that Wilkinson downplays. "Presumed consent" is a policy of taking without explicit consent, along with the suggestion that the reason underpinning the policy is the belief that the organ source would have consented if only he or she had been asked. No country in the world currently has a procurement policy defended on this ground. Routine procurement with opt-out -- the current policy in many European and Asian countries -- is based on arguments related to the overriding social importance of procurement, at least in cases in which the deceased has not opted out. These policies have nothing to do with the moral justification grounded in presumptions about consent. Just as laws authorize autopsy in medical examiner cases without any presumption that the deceased would have consented, many countries authorize procurement without such a presumption. The moral claim is that the social good takes precedence over personal sovereignty. Given Wilkinson's focus on the right of personal sovereignty, one would expect that he would have paid closer attention to the difference between the two justifications for taking organs in cases of uncertainty about the deceased's wishes.

Chapter 8 takes up conscription of organs. Given his heavy emphasis on personal sovereignty, it is hardly surprising that Wilkinson is not a defender of conscription. Conscription proposals are often softened to include an opt-out, which presumably he would then find more acceptable as long as no known violation of personal sovereignty is tolerated. This, of course, defeats the underlying priority of social benefit that underlies conscription policies, whether for military service or for organ procurement.

Chapter 9 takes up a rather esoteric policy question of transplant, usually referred to as "directed donation," but discussed by Wilkinson under the rubric of impartiality. The issue is whether organs should be taken when the donor or vendor puts conditions on the transaction. What if the donor restricts the gift to recipients of a certain race, religion, gender, sexual orientation, or age? Such transactions are frowned upon – prohibited, in fact, in the United States -- on the grounds that the transplant system, as a public system relying on all citizens to contribute, should allocate organs in a non-discriminatory way.

Wilkinson recognizes the morally suspect nature of such gifts, but challenges the presumption that the system must always be impartial. On grounds of the greater social good and the right of individuals to exercise their rights in gift-giving, Wilkinson defends directed donation when it would increase the supply of organs, or at least when no one would be made worse off than would otherwise be the case. In directed donation, since the organs would otherwise be discarded, it seems correct to say no one would be made worse off. In fact, some of those discriminated against are actually made slightly better off because with each directed donation someone above them on the waiting list might come off the waiting list. Thus, as it turns out, both utilitarians and those who would apply the Rawlsian difference principle to the "practice" of organ allocation have grounds for accepting directed donation. Nevertheless, such schemes are widely rejected. In the United States the opposition is almost instant and overwhelming. A considered moral judgment against the practice is well established. Appealing to personal sovereignty, Wilkinson rejects this conclusion (although he acknowledges that in specific cases, there may be disutilities in the form of a backlash against the procurement system by those in groups who perceive directed donation as discriminatory).

Finally, in chapter 10, Wilkinson moves to the natural conclusion of the personal sovereignty position on organs. He argues for markets in organs, at least organ procurement. Again, he acknowledges that it is an empirical question whether permitting the sale of a kidney or liver lobe would increase the supply. Some who are willing to give might withdraw their support for organ procurement if sale were permitted. Nevertheless, he plausibly suspects the supply of organs would increase with market incentives and, appealing to personal sovereignty, defends the policy. He takes up arguments against sale based on the protection of the well-being of the vendors. ("Donor" is clearly the wrong word here.) He also considers well-rehearsed arguments based on exploitation and injustice to the vendors. Here he poses serious objections to those who oppose markets on these grounds. He takes up the claims that commodification of the body is morally problematic, again challenging the defenders of this line of criticism of organ sales.

What is glaringly missing in the chapter on sales and throughout the volume is any careful analysis of the limits on the right of personal sovereignty. In contemporary medical ethics personal sovereignty is morally critical, but usually not taken to be unlimited. Many moral theories -- Kantianism, natural law theory, as well as more communitarian theories -- recognize some limits on personal sovereignty. The Kantian and Christian moral prohibition on self-killing by rational persons is a starting point; the well-recognized moral objection to selling oneself into slavery is another. Western law includes a "quasi-property right" in the human body that limits what the one legally possessing the body of the deceased may do with the body. Since the days of Antigone, humans have not had complete sovereignty over the dead body. Any defender of directed donation and markets in organs bears the responsibility for explicating what those limits are.

This small book puts forward the best philosophical analysis yet available of the grounds for donating and otherwise supplying organs for transplant. Wilkinson's positions are sometimes controversial, but always challenging. The book is essential for moral philosophers as well as those non-philosophers interested in the ultimate foundation of the important practice of organ transplant, but it probably will be frustrating for those non-philosophers working in transplant who are impatient to get on with the practical activities of the transplant world.