Ethics and the History of Indian Philosophy

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Shyam Ranganathan, Ethics and the History of Indian Philosophy, Motilal Banarasidass, 2007, 402pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 8120831934.

Reviewed by Matthew MacKenzie, Muhlenberg College


While its title might suggest a relatively straightforward overview of moral philosophy in the classical Indian tradition, Shyam Ranganathan's book is no mere survey.  Instead, it is a critical, revisionist, and systematic argument for the centrality of ethics in classical Indian philosophy, as against the more common view that, while there is an abundance of rigorous work in epistemology, metaphysic, logic, etc., in the Indian tradition, there is a paucity of such work in ethics.  In order to make his case for the centrality of ethics in Indian philosophy, Ranganathan develops an ambitious and controversial account of the term "dharma" (a term that has a wide variety of referents and is generally thought to have widely divergent uses) as fundamentally and always a moral term.  Further, in the course of defending his revisionist account of the term "dharma," he develops novel -- and again controversial -- approaches to determining the meaning of terms in general and of moral terms in particular.  Thus the first two-thirds of the book is taken up with issues in the philosophy of language and meta-ethics.  Then, having laid the groundwork for his approach to Indian ethics, in the final third of the book Ranganathan turns his attention to an examination of some of the key ethical themes in the various schools of classical Indian philosophy.  This section is quite comprehensive, with chapters on Buddhism, Jainism, Såîkhya and Yoga, Nyåya-Vaiùeúika, Mëmåîsa, Vedånta, Cårvåka, and a summary of Indian ethics.  Finally, he concludes the book with a thoughtful discussion of the importance of ethics to Indian philosophy and of the importance of Indian ethics as such.

Indian ethics and meaning(s) of "dharma"

Renowned scholar of Indian philosophy, B. K. Matilal, expresses a fairly common view of the tradition when he remarks:

Professional philosophers of India over the last two thousand years have been consistently concerned with the problems of logic and epistemology, metaphysics and soteriology, and sometimes they have made very important contributions to the global heritage of philosophy.  But, except some cursory comments and some insightful observations, the professional philosophers of India have very seldom discussed what we call "moral philosophy" today.  (4)

It is this type of view that Ranganathan sets out to argue against and, as mentioned above, he does so by putting forward a hermeneutically ambitious and controversial reading of the term "dharma."  It is widely agreed that "dharma" can refer to moral and social norms, and thus that it can sometimes mean "ethics" or "morality".  Hence, as Ranganathan argues, "if we could translate 'dharma' into 'ethics' or 'morality', consistently, we would then be justified in viewing references to 'dharma' in Indian philosophical literature as marking Indian thought on moral matters" (6).  And from there one could begin to assess the importance of ethics in Indian thought.

However, a problem with this approach immediately arises in that, on the standard view, not all dharma discourse is moral discourse.  According to what the author terms the Orthodox View, "dharma" has a number of different meanings (it can denote morality, justice, intrinsic quality, an ontologically basic event or property, etc.) and therefore the term cannot be consistently translated by a single term.  Alternatively, according to the so-called Conservative View, the various uses of "dharma" are explained etymologically.  (For instance, "dharma" is said to derive from the root "dhô", meaning to support or uphold.  Hence, the term can refer to moral law and to ontologically basic entities.)  Ranganathan rejects both of these views in favor of what he calls the Reform View, which consists of two theses.  First, "'dharma', in the language of Indian philosophy, stands for one concept with a clear moral meaning -- the concept of ethical or moral."  Second, "the concept that the terms 'dharma' and 'moral' stand for furnishes the common, semantic ground for the meaningful philosophical disagreement on the topic of ethics" (13).

But if, as the author admits, "dharma" can, in different contexts, refer to quite a disparate range of things -- attributes, ritual, constituents of reality, and so on (22) -- on what basis can he claim that the term always means "moral"?  It would appear that the Orthodox View is supported; "dharma" sometimes means "moral" and sometimes it does not.  Ranganathan responds to this line of thought by arguing that "dharma" should not be defined in terms of its referents, but rather in terms of the intention with which it is used.  In his terminology, a term can be defined either by its typical extention (i.e., its typical referents) or by the typical intention with which the term is used, or some combination thereof.  Thus an extentional definition of a term will be based primarily on the (kinds of) objects to which that term refers, while an intentional definition will be based primarily on the attitude or intentions of the user of the term.  For instance, the term "pleasurable" may be applied to a very wide and internally inconsistent range of extentions.  If one were to try to define it extentionally, one might be led to hold that the masochist and the nonmasochist simply do not mean the same thing when using the term.  However, defined intentionally, in terms of a having a positive disposition toward one's referent (whatever it is), "pleasure" can mean the same thing for the masochist and the nonmasochist alike (19).

So, on Ranganathan's account, the Orthodox View rests on the faulty assumption that "dharma" should be defined extentionally.  Once this assumption is made, recognizing the disparate extentions of the term naturally leads to the conclusion that it has no single meaning, and hence no single English equivalent.  In contrast, the author holds that while "dharma" has quite disparate extentions, it has only one intentional meaning: "moral." Moreover, he argues that moral terms (like "dharma" on his view) should be defined purely intentionally -- that is, there should be no extentionalist constraints on whether "dharma" should (always) be defined as a moral term.  Thus, for example, Buddhist philosophers at times use "dharma" to refer to the basic constituents of reality in the context of discussions about, for instance, the number and types of these constituents, whether composite entities are reducible to them, how they interact causally, and so on.  In such a case it would be tempting to think that what the Buddhist philosophers are up to here is ontology and not ethics, and therefore, given what it refers to in this context, that "dharma" is being used in a non-moral sense.  But Ranganathan argues that we ought to resist this temptation because it is likely to lead to question-begging assumptions about the scope of morality in the Indian tradition (26).

The idea here is that, "the only plausible way that the Extentionalist could exclude considering 'dharma' as a persistent moral term in Indian philosophy is by having decided, in advance, what extentions are moral in nature, and what are not" (26).  If it is decided in advance that, whatever morality is about, it isn't about the constituents of reality, then we may have begged the question against those in the Indian tradition who might hold that this is a proper subject-matter for moral philosophy.  The Buddhist philosophers may look like they are doing ontology and not ethics, and therefore that "dharma" is not being used as a moral term in this context, but that might well be because there is a substantive philosophical disagreement over the proper scope of the moral.

The problem with this argument, though, is that it gives too simplistic an account of how an extentionalist might go about determining whether "dharma" is being used as a moral term.  The extentionalist need not decide once and for all in advance what extentions are or are not moral in nature.  Rather her own intuitions about the relevant extentions can be taken as fallible guides.  Other things being equal, finding a discourse in which philosophers use "dharma" to refer to the constituents of reality -- rather than actions, rules, rituals, duties, norms, virtues, etc. -- is evidence that the term is being used in a non-moral way.  This interpretation could be overridden in light of other considerations, but it still, for all that, could be a relevant consideration and not necessarily question-begging. Yet, Ranganathan's intentionalism denies this.  Furthermore, the role the term plays in various moves within the discourse -- questions, judgments, inferences, arguments -- will be relevant to deciding whether "dharma" is being used as a moral term.  That is, we must look not only at what the word refers to, but also how it is being used in the context in order to assess its meaning.  In the example at hand, if what the Buddhist philosophers are doing with the term looks a lot like what we call ontology, and very little like what we call ethics, then that is prima facie warrant for the claim that "dharma" isn't always used as a moral term.  It seems to me that the burden of proof is on the intentionalist in this kind of case.

The Anger Inclination Thesis

Now if the intentionalist is to define moral terms without reference to their typical extentions, some account is needed of the attitudes or intentions that typically accompany the use of moral terms.  In order to do this, Ranganathan first examines and rejects an impressive range of views about the nature of moral statements, and then offers his own account, namely, The Anger Inclination Thesis (AIT).  According to the AIT:

1)  a moral statement is an apparently meaningful claim with evaluative import, about which

2)  there is, attached to it, an inclination to express anger, likely in the absence of mitigating reasons, should the evaluative import of the statement be violated.  (53-54)

On this view, moral statements, and the domain of the moral more generally, is marked out by its "potential explosiveness" (108).  Further, "the prime function of a moral term," writes Ranganathan, "is to intentionally refer to the anger inclination attached to an evaluation" (71).  The meaning of "dharma," then, is determined by this reactive attitude, rather than the kinds of things to which this attitude is directed.  Hence, the definition does not presume to encroach on substantive philosophical debate over the proper scope of morality.

As evidence for his account of "dharma," Ranganathan points out several examples of a more or less explicit connection between "dharma" and anger inclination.  His conclusion is that, "the bare moralness of 'dharma' in classical Indian thought is evident from the fact that it stands for things that people are inclined to get angry over" (96).  The attempt to understand moral terms and the domain of the moral in general in terms of characteristic reactive attitudes is interesting and plausible, even if one has reservations about the details of the Anger Inclination Thesis.  Ranganathan's examples of a connection between dharma discourse and anger inclination are straightforward and hermeneutically sound -- that is, the examples are not cherry-picked and the interpretations are not stretched.

However, what these examples show is that dharma discourse is often or even usually moral discourse, but not that it is always moral discourse.  Ranganthan admits that, "a hard-line position has been consistently adopted in the argument for the Reform View; that there is such a thing as an essential meaning to all moral terms" (126), and thus that "dharma" has a single, essential, and moral meaning.  Isn't it possible that, while the term typically or paradigmatically has a moral meaning, there are also deviant uses of the term where it has a non-moral meaning?  The author addresses the idea that "dharma" might be a family resemblance term (126-127, 147-155), but his rejection of the idea is based on a specifically Wittgensteinian account of family resemblance.  Yet the idea that there could be deviant, non-moral meanings of "dharma" does not rest on a strictly Wittgensteinian approach.

Returning to the Buddhist use of "dharma" to refer to the basic constituents of reality, how are we to tell whether this is a (deviant) non-moral use of "dharma" or a (perhaps exotic) moral use of the term?  Let us grant that the fact that the term refers to constituents of reality does not settle the matter.  Is the function of the term "to intentionally refer to the anger inclination attached to an evaluation"?  In the context of what is usually called Buddhist metaphysics (or ontology), the term "dharma" is employed in a way that gives no clear indication that it is intended to express moral evaluation or to communicate an anger inclination.  In other words, sometimes "dharma" has an ontological meaning and not a moral one.  Of course, Buddhist philosophers hold that ontological issues can have profound moral import (and one can imagine a Buddhist philosopher who is inclined to get angry over ontological disputes), but it does not follow from this that "dharma" must have a moral meaning even in the context of technical Buddhist metaphysics.  So, while Ranganathan's general account of "dharma" as a (typically) moral term is plausible, his "hard-line" insistence on a single, essential meaning for the term in Indian philosophy is less plausible.

Indian ethics

Approximately the final third of Ranganathan's book is taken up with a discussion of the nature of ethics as such and a survey of the moral philosophies of the major schools of classical Indian philosophy.  The chapters are brief, clear, and generally insightful.  Of particular note is Ranganathan's inclusion of a chapter on the oft-neglected materialist school, Cårvåka.  On the author's account, the main task of Indian moral philosophers was justificative ethics, or the defense of moral first principles (191).  This is an interesting and fruitful approach for a short survey of Indian ethics.  Furthermore, the survey never loses the thread of the argument for the Reform View developed in the first two-thirds of the book.  Ideed, Ranganathan argues that the Reform View and the AIT rule out interpretations of Indian moral philosophy in terms of either the puruúårthas (the four ends or values of the person) or mokúa (spiritual liberation).  Both are morally relevant, but neither can serve as the master concept in terms of which Indian ethics is to be understood.

Having surveyed the moral philosophies of the main schools of the classical Indian tradition, and having articulated what he takes to be their moral first principles, Ranganathan returns to the issue of the relative place of moral philosophy in the tradition.  Given the centrality and importance of the term "dharma" for all of the main schools of Indian philosophy, Vedic and non-Vedic, and given the moral meaning of this term, one can, he argues, conclude that ethics is central to Indian philosophy.


Overall, Ranganathan's book is clear, well written, provocative, and exhaustively argued.  Methodologically, his mix of Indology with contemporary work in the philosophy of language and meta-ethics provides for a challenging and rewarding approach to Indian moral philosophy.  And while this reviewer is not convinced of the truth of either the hard-line version of the Reform View or the Anger Inclination Thesis, Ranganathan's broader claim for the centrality of ethics in Indian philosophy is sound.