Ethics and the Problem of Evil

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James P. Sterba, Ethics and the Problem of Evil, Indiana University Press, 2017, 171pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253024312.

Reviewed by Michael Ruse, Florida State University


Almost twenty years ago, I wrote a little book on the relationship between Darwinism and Christianity (Ruse 2001). I had thought, before I began, that one of the biggest issues would be with the problem of evil. How could an all-powerful, all-loving God, allow evil? Charles Darwin himself worried about this one. Early in 1860, about six months after the Origin of Species was published, he wrote to his good friend the American botanist Asa Gray: " I cannot persuade myself that a beneficent & omnipotent God would have designedly created the Ichneumonidae with the express intention of their feeding within the living bodies of caterpillars, or that a cat should play with mice" (Darwin 1985, 8, 224). To my surprise, as with the writing of all of my best books, I found I was wrong. I hardly worried at all about the problem of evil. In fact, if anything, Darwinism seemed to help, because if the world had to be created through law, Darwin's hypothesis about the struggle for existence leading to natural selection showed explicitly why this would entail pain and suffering. Out would come the Leibnizian argument. God being all-powerful does not mean He can do the impossible, and if creation involves pain, so be it. Where I worried and continue to worry is about how an undirected process like evolution through natural selection guarantees the arrival of humans, surely something necessary in the Christian story.

Since then, I have often wondered why it was that I was so untroubled by the evil argument. I think it was because it all seemed so settled. Darwinism for or against just wasn't going to make any difference. So move on. For believers like my parents, the argument was almost irrelevant. They were Quakers, and in the mystical tradition of that particular religion, they simply argued that God moves in mysterious ways. We cannot know all, including the reasons why evil occurs. I don't mean that they were totally irrational. It was clear that they strongly sympathized with the claim of the poet Keats that this world of ours is a vale of soul-making. Both had had rather tough childhoods and this was their way of making sense of things. I should say, to their great credit, they turned their life experiences into dedicated service to others.

For non-believers like me, the argument was decisive. In part, it was that once you start saying that God is mysterious, there is no end. How can we claim to know anything about God? The things we like we say prove His existence. The things we don't like we say are irrelevant or mysterious. In part, the stronger part, it was that as I grew up in the 1950s, there was memory of the two world wars, and then the full horrors of the Holocaust were being unveiled. My generation didn't just think that you cannot solve the problem of the death of Anne Frank. We didn't want to solve the problem. Some things are just unforgivable and cannot and must not be explained away.

I suspect I was not alone, because it was around this time that one or two influential anti-God articles appeared, all resting on the problem of evil. John Mackie's (1955) was a classic. End of discussion. Except of course it wasn't, because before long people of faith and skill -- John Hick (1978) and Alvin Plantinga (1974) , to name two -- were leading a revival that sparked vigorous and ongoing discussion down to the present. Through the present and to the future, as is shown by a newly published volume of essays edited by James P. Sterba. This volume is based on a couple of conferences at Notre Dame, where the aim was to see if, by looking at things through the lens of modern philosophical thought about morality, ethics, progress could be made on this problem of problems. I am not sure that this intention was carried through as fully as it might have been, and I warn the reader that the discussions are not introductory. They are often rather technical and show their conference origins, being parts of ongoing discussions, where not too much help is given to the reader in getting up to speed. For all that, I would agree with Sterba when, at the end of his collection, he claims that much has been achieved.

This said, I would be scared to death were I a contributor to a collection edited by Sterba. After the praise, he then sets about pointing to the deficiencies in everybody's arguments. Systematically. "Especially problematic." "We still need a good reason." "Explanatory deficient." "Has failed to show." "Strains to find something." "This cannot be right." "Seems to be taken in." These were some of the friendlier comments. As one who has done a huge amount of editing, I confess to admiration and awe. There are few of us drudges who have not felt the urge, occasionally, to do as Sterba has done. Few of us have the nerve to do it. As it happens, I agree with much that Sterba has to say. But be warned that -- supposing you read all of the book before you set to work, which is not always the case -- reviewing a volume like this is bound to be colored by what comes at the end.

We start with "A Modest Proposal? Caveat Emptor! Moral Theory and Problems of Evil" by Marilyn McCord Adams. Adams, who died recently, was a philosopher-theologian, an Anglican priest, and this shows in the way that she acknowledges and grapples with what so troubles people like me. The sheer awfulness of so much evil. Sometimes things are not just bad, they are horrifically bad. In the face of these evils, what mockery is it to talk of a good God. I will say, however, that having raised the problem, I don't see Adams genuinely tackling it. This may be a function of writing a short piece against presumed knowledge of a wider background. Sterba is right: "what Adams does not take up is the question of how an all-good God could have allowed the horrendously evil consequences of serious wrongdoing to be inflicted on innocent victims in the first place" (155).

"Kant, Job, and the Problem of Evil" by John Hare is, expectedly given that it is on Kant, rather technical and hard reading. Fifty years ago, I was the student of two eminent Kantians, Stephan Körner in England and Lewis White Beck in the US. Kant back then was an epistemologist. As I have returned to him in recent years, now much interested in the relationship between science and religion, I cannot believe that such intelligent people had so truncated a vision. Possibly reflecting the fact that I am more a historian of ideas than an analytic philosopher, I see the key to understanding Kant's whole philosophy was the huge influence of his Pietist childhood and the ways in which "making room for faith" was the fundamental drive.

Writing from the perspective I endorse, I was not surprised to see that Hare makes much of Kant's fascination with Job, where we do get that sense of mystery. Job offers no reasons. "I did it. Not you. Why should you expect to understand everything I think and do?" Sterba thinks Hare rather lets Kant off the hook, because, although Kant prohibits intentionally doing evil, he certainly permits it. My suspicion is that by pushing us into the realm of faith, Kant is allowing that sense of mystery not permitted in the world of knowledge. We just don't know or could know why these things happen as they do. I do think Hare is wrong in criticizing Kant for tying morality too closely to religion. As one who was brought up in a tradition (Quakerism) that was, like Pietism, more at the radical end of Christianity, there is no such thing as morality tied too tightly to religion. The Sermon on the Mount said it all.

"Good Persons, Good Aims, and the Problem of Evil" by Linda Zagzebski takes up the distinction between a person's character and moral worth and the moral worth or standing of what that person does or brings about. Through this distinction, she sees a way of getting God off the hook for bad things, because He could be very good and yet, through no fault of His own, matters do not turn out very well. Taking "the claim that a good person would not act in ways that God acts," she argues: "The fact that there are evil states of affairs in the world is not sufficient to establish such a claim" (50). I don't really need Sterba to point out that there is something a little uncomfortable here. Either God set things up so that Anne Frank could and did die, or He didn't. At the very least, God has a lot of heavy-duty explaining to do and this is not given here. As I said at the beginning, I am not even sure that that kind of explaining would be enough for me. I am with The Brothers Karamazov here. If the consequences were going to be so awful, why did God get into the creating business in the first place?

"Does God Cooperate with Evil?" by Laura Garcia spends much time distinguishing between cooperating with evil and simply permitting it. Himmler cooperated with evil. Many Germans simply permitted it. Obviously if God cooperated with evil, He cannot be good. Garcia seems to think that permitting is less troublesome. I am not sure we even need our sturdy editor to put us right here. "The main problem, as atheists see it, is with God's permitting evil, when evil is done, particularly horrendous evil, and God could prevent it" (158).

"The Problem of Evil: Excessive Unnecessary Suffering" by Bruce Russell invokes some of those neat examples so beloved of analytic philosophers. You have a crowd of fellows in a cave -- ninety-pound weaklings like René Descartes and Immanuel Kant. Some rather portly chap -- St. Thomas Aquinas, of whom it is said they had to cut a circle so he could sit at table -- is stuck in the entrance. The folk in the cave have no hope of easing out the portly Dominican. The waters are rising and all, including the saintly blockage, face drowning. The principle of double effect says that you should never do evil that good might come. Nevertheless, even though he dies, it seems that it would be acceptable to dynamite the angelic doctor. "I think it would be morally permissible, even obligatory, to blow the big guy free" (92). I confess I have some trouble seeing the analogy between the saintly Thomas stuck in the entrance and Anne Frank dying in Bergen-Belsen. How is Anne's death going to benefit some of us or any of us at all? In any case, sniffs Sterba, blowing up the fat chap is not violating the principle of double effect. The people in the cave are saving themselves rather than (intentionally) harming the saint. They are simply doing what is necessary.

"Beyond the Impasse: Contemporary Moral Theory and the Crisis of Skeptical Theism" by Stephen J. Wykstra also worries away at the double effect principle and its relevance for God and evil. If you cannot do evil to get good, then how can we say that God allows (permits, urges) evil in order to make for a brighter day tomorrow? Wykstra turns to John Calvin for help. Calvin insists that God's sovereignty means just that. God is responsible right down the line. When Joseph's brothers kicked him into the pit prior to selling him into slavery, God didn't just permit this. He made it all happen. Which suggests then that although, when we sell someone into slavery, it is a wrong action, it is not necessarily a wrong action when God sells -- or makes it the case that someone will sell -- a person into slavery. There are two levels of causation. The brothers are acting out of hatred. God is acting out of love, for He sees how this will lead to happiness for Joseph and his family.

To which the Ruse response -- or rather the Sterba-Ruse response -- is that learning of the beliefs of Calvin is usually the first step to rejecting them. The argument is flagrantly fallacious. The whole point of the principle of double effect is that, no matter how desirable the consequences, you shouldn't do evil. Early in the last war -- my example -- the Brits were desperate. Hitler was conquering all and the Luftwaffe was bombing their land into non-being. So, Churchill ordered a counter-strike: bomb German cities including civilians. This will scare Germany as a whole and divert resources. It was hugely effective. But it was morally wrong. It was not as morally wrong as the later obliteration bombing -- Dresden and all that -- but it was wrong. God letting Joseph suffer was morally wrong.

Finally, "Perfection, Evil, and Morality" by Stephen Maitzen. Maitzen is a self-proclaimed atheist, and I wonder if in his piece he is arguing tongue in cheek. He claims that if you believe in God, then you must believe in a perfect God. Instead of the ontological ontological argument, he offers a kind of epistemological ontological argument. A God who is not perfect is not up to snuff. "If God is imperfect, why think that God has the power to make the universe out of nothing, or even the power to make the universe out of preexisting stuff?" Excuse me! Why do we even have to think that God is creator? What about Aristotle's Unmoved Mover? It accepts the universe as eternal, if it is even aware of the universe that is. It seems a bit disloyal at this point to go it alone without Sterba -- "Maitzen seems to be taken in by the account of the heavenly afterlife, defended by some theists" (163) -- but, apart from all pretences having now been dropped at this being a volume about ethics and evil, to see if one is possible, I really don't see why someone who worries about the problem of evil shouldn't play around with various God ideas.

Suppose one thinks like the New England Transcendentalists that God is some kind of primeval force rather than a person. Such a God might be indifferent to human or any suffering. This is the God of Emily Dickinson:

Apparently with no surprise
To any happy Flower
The Frost beheads it at its play --
In accidental power --
The blonde Assassin passes on --
The Sun proceeds unmoved
To measure off another Day
For an Approving God.

I don't say you should believe in a God like this; just that evil doesn't rule it out.

I had fun reading and reviewing this book. It is not condescending to say that we have good minds working on good problems. I am not convinced and I am not spurred to keep digging. This, as I said at the beginning, is partly because (reflecting my line of work) I think there are more interesting challenges in the Darwinism-Christianity encounter. What price original sin if Adam and Eve never existed? Could we have Christianity if we had evolved as intelligent hymenoptera where the sisters kill off the brothers when winter approaches? Are Christians better on the consciousness problem than Darwinians? My lack of conviction is partly because, as I said at the beginning, not only do I not think that the problem of evil can be solved, I don't want it to be solved. I don't want a neat philosophical wrap-up of the death of Anne Frank. In a way, and please fault me and not the authors or editor, I don't want a book like Ethics and the Problem of Evil to succeed. I am not sure whether to be proud of myself as a human being or a little bit ashamed as a philosopher. Time to take a leaf out of the tough-minded book of Sterba and to have the courage of my convictions.


Darwin, C. 1985. The Correspondence of Charles Darwin. Cambridge University Press.

Hick, J. 1978. Evil and the God of Love. Harper and Row.

Mackie, J. L. 1955. Evil and omnipotence. Mind 64: 200-212.

Plantinga, A. 1974. God, Freedom, and Evil. Harper and Row.Ruse, M. 2001. Can a Darwinian be a Christian? The Relationship between Science and Religion. Cambridge University Press.