Ethics and the Quest for Wisdom

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Robert Kane, Ethics and the Quest for Wisdom, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 287pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521199933.

Reviewed by Alexa Forrester, Franklin & Marshall College


Robert Kane's Ethics and the Quest for Wisdom is an exciting and ambitious book. Kane introduces and defends a "complete ethical theory" that represents a genuinely novel approach to normative ethics. His overarching theme is that moral constraints flow from the search for wisdom in the ancient philosophical sense, which involves both "explaining what and why things have objective reality and what and why things have objective worth" (170). The latter of these two goals is Kane's primary concern.

For Kane, the cornerstone of the genuine search for wisdom regarding worth is a moral principle that he calls the "Ends Principle." At first glance the Ends Principle looks identical to Kant's Formula of Humanity: "Treat all persons as ends in every situation, and no one as means only" (48). But it differs in how it interprets 'treating others as ends'. In Kane's theory, this requires treating others with openness, which "is to allow them to pursue their ways of life and realize their desired ends without interference" (35). Like the openness scientists extend to competing theories, openness to the lives of others is not an end in itself, but rather an attitude required for a genuine and effective search for wisdom. "The [Ends Principle] posits an initial attitude or stance toward persons … as a way of determining who is and who is not objectively worthy of being so treated … The initial attitude of openness is part of a search to find this out" (187). "Openness is a way of searching for the absolute point of view, not that point of view itself" (113).

Importantly, in order for one to treat all persons with openness in every situation, it must be the case that all other persons are treating each other with openness as well. For, one cannot allow others to pursue their plans without any interference if their plans interfere with each other. Thus, in order to implement the Ends Principle, we need to establish what Kane calls the "moral sphere" -- a state in which all persons treat all other persons with openness respect, according them openness "to the degree that one can do so while maintaining a moral sphere in which all persons can be treated with openness by all others" (35).

The Ends Principle anchors a theory within which right actions are those that maintain and repair the moral sphere and wrong actions are those that threaten and damage the moral sphere. But, as Kane notes, this is not enough to answer the question of how we ought to live. To complete the picture, in chapters 5-14, he presents his theory of value, which takes value to exist in a four-dimensional spectrum.

The first dimension is made up of basic value experiences, like pain, pleasure, annoyance, delight, fear, joy, etc. These felt reactions are either enjoyable or uncomfortable and are intrinsically good or bad accordingly. The second dimension of value "includes not only experiences, but also activities undertaken by individuals in the pursuit of plans, intentions, interests and purposes" (74). Value in this dimension is a "measure of the success or failure of the practical engagements we pursue" (74). Importantly, the second dimension includes the first dimension in the sense that practical engagements involve a succession of value experiences through time. Moving up the spectrum, the third dimension includes both the first and second dimensions of value, but the value here is attached not just to what we get from our activities and experiences, but further, "how they define what we are" (86). What counts as valuable in this dimension is relative to the cultures in which we exist, since those cultures provide the roles and standards which give meaning to our identities. Of course, one can always question whether third-dimensional goods are really worth pursuing. This brings us to the fourth dimension of value. Kane writes:

What might be meant by a fourth dimension of value is not so easily described and many thinkers would deny it exists at all. But while the existence of a fourth dimension of value may be controversial, it seems to be presupposed by much of what humans have had to say about the good and the right (95).

If such a dimension exists, and Kane believes it does, fourth-dimensional value is non-relative worth, in the sense that ways of life that are worthy in the fourth dimension have worth that should be recognized from every point of view. It is exactly this kind of worth that those who seek wisdom in the ancient philosophical sense are after. And herein lies a key aspect of Kane's argument: though one can never be sure that one's life is good in the fourth dimension, if one fails to show concern for others or treats them as merely means, one guarantees that one's life is not worthy in the fourth dimension, i.e., not worthy from all points of view. Thus, concern and openness are, according to Kane, prerequisites for a life that is good in the fourth dimension.

In a nutshell, a given state of affairs or experience is valuable if and only if it is valuable (i.e., good) from at least some point of view, in some dimension, and not trumped by being bad in a higher dimension. This arrangement permits a plurality of objectively worthy lives and does not require us to adjudicate one as better than another so long as they are mutually realizable.

One area in which Kane's position is less than clear regards the conditions under which one attains fourth-dimensional value. Consider, for example, a happy and not particularly self-reflective hermit who does nothing but eat vegetables and grains and tend his garden. He lives in a way that is valuable in the first and second dimensions, and is entirely benign with regard to the flourishing of others. Is his life good in the fourth dimension? I believe Kane is committed to answering positively. Here is why.

Borrowing the term "inscape" from poet Gerard Manley Hopkins to refer to the "what-it-is-like-to-be-ness" of a given conscious point of view, Kane writes, "Our ethical obligations extend to all beings with inscapes capable of suffering" (146). So it appears that Kane believes that all beings with inscapes are initially worthy of provisional concern from others solely by virtue of their having inscapes. And while it is possible for beings with inscapes to diminish their worthiness, it seems unlikely that the harmless hermit has done anything to diminish his worthiness, given that he is not interfering with anyone else's flourishing. But Kane also believes that what is of relative value to an individual objectively worthy of concern is thereby objectively valuable. He writes, "By the worthiness of their inscapes to be and to flourish, [individuals] 'raise up' something that is valuable to them from the mere relative value to something of objective worth in the universe" (165). Thus, because the hermit is worthy of concern and his vegetable tending life is valuable to him, his vegetable tending life should be "raised up" to the fourth dimension.

Notice, many non-persons may fall under descriptions similar to the hermit: beings who a) have inscapes and b) are accidentally benign with respect to the flourishing of others. We might expect the things these individuals value -- a squirrel's stash of nuts, a wild pig's nest, a bird's unobstructed flight path, a young child's collection of pebbles -- to count as good in the fourth dimension. But this contradicts Kane's claim elsewhere that "only self-reflective beings can reach the third (and eventually the fourth) dimension of value" (144). Perhaps this confusion can be resolved by interpreting "reach" in this claim to mean, "aim for and knowingly attain." Certainly a harmless bird does not know its flight path is valuable in the fourth dimension, even if it is. In any case, one is left wanting clarity in this regard.

Additional confusion arises regarding the scope of our obligations. Kane writes, "[The] moral theory of Chapters 2-4 focused on obligations to other persons. But … our ethical obligations extend to all beings with inscapes" (146). His language here suggests that you can wrong non-persons by failing to concern yourself with their inscapes. But so failing does not necessarily break the moral sphere, if maintaining the moral sphere only requires us to treat persons with openness respect. Hence, treating non-persons cruelly must be wrong in virtue of something other than breaking the moral sphere.

Though Kane never makes this explicit, I believe he is committed to the view that the Ends Principle entails not only maintaining a moral sphere among those capable of regarding each other with openness, but also maintaining (what I would call) a sphere of compassionate cooperation among all those with inscapes: that is, working to establish a sphere in which we can extend concern to each individual as much as is compatible with extending concern to all individuals. In fact, Kane sometimes writes as if extending openness to persons is just a particular way of extending concern toward persons (144).

In short, it appears that extending concern to those with inscapes is actually the fundamental obligation in Kane's theory of right. But this fact is obscured by his presentation: he devotes full chapters to explicating the moral sphere, he names his theory the "Moral Sphere Theory" (MST), and he often uses the Ends Principle as if it were interchangeable with the imperative to maintain the moral sphere. In contrast, he introduces the concepts of concern for inscapes late in the book, in chapters devoted to his theory of good, not his theory of right. These expository facts suggest that Kane himself may not recognize extending concern as fundamental. Even if Kane accepts that the Ends Principle entails both maintaining the moral sphere and maintaining a sphere of compassionate cooperation, there remains the question of whether maintaining the moral sphere is just a special case of maintaining a sphere of compassionate cooperation, or whether the two are independently motivated. Again, more clarity is needed.

The later chapters of the book are dedicated to contrasting MST with the most influential ethical theories -- including contemporary versions of intuitionism, Kantianism, consequentialism, and contractarianism -- to illustrate its significant theoretical merits. Many of these comparisons are compelling, especially because MST often avoids the problems and counterintuitive consequences generated by its competitors. On a general level, Kane deserves praise for being extremely diligent and well read, extending credit to those whose ideas have shaped his and offering thorough and charitable readings of his competitors. The book is valuable not only for the novelty and promise of its central ideas, but also its clear exegesis of other important positions.

The only shortcoming in this regard is a lack of engagement with the American pragmatists, particularly John Dewey, whom he mentions only in passing (204). There are two reasons that Dewey deserves a higher profile in this work. First, there are notable similarities between Kane's approach to ethics and Dewey's. Both start from the recognition that uncertainty in matters normative is unavoidable; they both frame philosophy as a method for proceeding responsibly in the face of that uncertainty; and they both urge ethicists to approach their work more like scientists, testing value propositions in experience. Thus both Dewey and Kane can be viewed as promoters (rare as they are) of ethical empiricism.

Second, Kane's theory represents a significant improvement over Dewey's empiricism in the following regard. Since Dewey believed the quest for ethical certainty was folly, he urged us to concentrate instead on resolving the specific normative conflicts that confront us as they arise, adjusting and testing our norms as we go. However, taking this approach leads to a problematic type of disenfranchisement. Our preconceptions about who and what matters ethically speaking influence how we judge the results of our experiments in living. So, in cases where those who are affected negatively by our ways of life cannot effectively resist or object to our actions, we may judge our value experiments to be successful simply because the ill effects are not borne by us or those who we happen to care about. Kane's emphasis on aspiring to wisdom, insofar as it requires us to evaluate our experiments from all points of view, rather than simply from the perspective of those who matter within our particular value frameworks, offers a compelling solution to this shortcoming of Dewey's ethical empiricism. Kane has missed an opportunity to clarify this genealogy here.

In general, Kane's book has many strengths: It helps establish ethical territory that is neither deontological nor consequentialist. It preserves space for both ideal theory and non-ideal theory, and provides a framework for understanding the proper relationship between them (49). It grounds and unifies common intuitions regarding prima facie duties and explains when and why they are defeasible. And its central moral principle -- the Ends Principle -- stacks up well against competitors, demanding responses from the field.

In fact, the Ends Principle is so compelling that the book leaves me pondering whether there is any way to motivate it besides the quest for wisdom. The worry here is that which attends any system of ethics grounded in a hypothetical imperative. Here the imperative is this: if you seek wisdom, you must abide by the Ends Principle. But what of those who do not seek wisdom, either because they believe they have already attained it or because they believe it is not important? Do these individuals commit wrongs when they lie, cheat, steal, kill, and otherwise violate the Ends Principle?

Here is what I think Kane might believe and so should say in response to such questions: everybody values something. But the confidence dogmatic individuals have in the norms and value frameworks that shape their ways of life is unwarranted. In contrast, one who seeks wisdom in the manner described by Kane is doing the best that any person possibly can to weed out normative error (just as scientists use the scientific method to weed out descriptive error), and so whatever confidence they have in their way of life is warranted. Such persons are doing the best they can to live well. Of course, the dogmatist is not likely to concede this last point, but this is only because the dogmatist has failed to appreciate that his confidence in his own way of life is unwarranted.

This leads to a final question: does questing for wisdom in the sense articulated here by Kane really represent the best one can do to live well? The jury is out, and more clarification is needed, but if the answer is yes, then it might just be that Kane has given us everything we could ask for from an ethical theory.