Ethics and War: An Introduction

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Steven P. Lee, Ethics and War: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 330pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521898836.

Reviewed by Nick Fotion, Emory University


In keeping with his title, Lee introduces his readers to the subject of ethics and war by clarifying a cluster of terms that surround war. War, he defines as "the use of force for political purposes by one side in a large scale armed conflict where both (or all) sides are states or other large organized groups" (p. 9). His definition allows him to include civil and guerrilla wars under the meaning of war, but to exclude (military) skirmishes, a "war" between the Northside and Southside mobsters in Chicago, riots, and family feuds. He also characterizes various forms of realism (e.g., descriptive, prescriptive, and moralized realism) and pacifism (e.g. particularistic, universal, partial, and active pacifism). In his first chapter, Lee also introduces his readers to just war theory, and then says a few things about how that theory relates to realism and pacifism.

In his second chapter he continues writing in an introductory mode, but now focuses on the history of just war theory. His account is Western (European) in nature, so he tells us nothing about the interest the Chinese philosopher Mo Tzu[1] has in how wars can be started justly (jus ad bellum) or how another Chinese philosopher, Mencius,[2] speaks to the issue of starting a just civil war. Still, his account of the contributions of Augustine, Aquinas, Grotius, Vitoria, Vattel, among others is concise, precise, and clear. At this point, one is tempted to think "So far, so good."

But then in the next four, perhaps five, chapters there is a change of tone in the writing. I'll explain what the change amounts to shortly. But to understand that change, it is necessary to say some things about the content of these chapters. Chapters 3 and 4 are devoted to jus ad bellum (justice of the war) issues; while Chapters 5 and 6 to jus in bello (justice in the war) issues.

In the first two of these chapters, we are presented with two main paradigms (sub-theories) concerning the main principle of jus ad bellum: viz, just cause. Historically, one of these is the national self-defense paradigm. In its strongest form this paradigm tells us that a nation has a just cause for entering a war if and only if it acts defensively to repel open aggression. The paradigm might be stretched a bit to allow a nation to go to war not just when it, but also when an ally, is being attacked. But this paradigm does not allow a nation to go to war justly when another nation is in great need of humanitarian help.

Many thinkers, including Lee, take this to be a flaw in the national defense paradigm and so are tempted to turn to a different theory. The replacement is called the human rights paradigm. This paradigm makes it possible for a nation to go to war to protect the basic (human) rights of those in another nation who are victimized by their own or some other government, or by some ethnic group, but also to defend its own people from external aggression.

By the time he works through his discussion of just cause, many of Lee's readers will not be able to resist asking "Is this really an introductory book?" So many variations of the just cause paradigms have been considered, and so many authors have been cited, that Lee's book increasingly looks more like a reference rather than an introductory book. I don't mean this as criticism since as a reference book Ethics and War serves that purpose very well. For example, when Lee turns to a discussion of the other jus ad bellum criteria (e.g., good intentions, last resort and proportionality), his readers will find all (or most) of the options for interpreting these criteria are described clearly and referenced copiously. But, again, beginners to the discussion of war and ethics might find themselves mentally exhausted making this and that distinction, trying to understand how this philosopher of just war theory differs from that one, and trying to understand how this paradigm differs, ever so subtlety, from that one.

Having dealt with justice of the war (jus ad bellum) issues, Lee turns to those concerned with justice in the war (jus in bello). Traditionally there are two principles at play once a war starts. One is proportionality having to do with battles and campaigns (as against the jus ad bellum version of this principle which applies to war as a whole). The other is discrimination. Military personnel are permitted to attack certain targets (e.g. the other side's soldiers) but not others (e. g., women and children). Lee adds a third principle to the list that he calls due care (e.g., military personnel and their leaders are supposed to try hard each day to keep civilian casualties to a minimum). As is common in most discussions of jus in bello, Lee spends most of his time in Chapters 5 and 6 with the principle of discrimination. He does so with good reason. There are lots of questions about this principle. Are civilians working in a tank factory legitimate targets? If they are, can they be targeted when they are in their homes or only when they are at work in their factories? Should one shoot at guerrillas who have deliberately barricaded themselves in a high-rise apartment building full of civilians? What if these civilians have been helping the guerrillas by, for example, feeding, housing, medicating, them? What about dual-use targets (e.g., a bridge used both by civilians and the enemy's military)? On and on. As is his custom, Lee discusses issues that surround discrimination in such great detail that the view that Lee's book is not an introductory read is confirmed.

In great detail again, Lee spends time discussing a different kind of just-war-theory issue. To fight well, a military force must satisfy all of the jus in bello criteria. That at least is the traditional view. It is said to be symmetrical since both sides, the aggressor and the victim, can in principle satisfy these criteria. However, some have argued for an asymmetrical view that both sides cannot satisfy the criteria. The victim nation can, in principle, since it is being aggressed against. But the aggressor has started the war unjustly so that everything it does is unjust. Even if the aggressor nation treats prisoners well, it is still acting unjustly since it has "no right" to hold prisoners in the first place. Further, the aggressor nation's military has no right to defend itself against the defensive tactics of the victim nation's military, any more than a robber has a right to defend himself against his victims. In other words, there is asymmetry here because one side can act justly in war while the other side, the bad guys, cannot. In the end, Lee rejects this asymmetric view. Of course, there is for him asymmetry on the level of jus ad bellum. The aggressor is going to be on the side of bad, while the victim nation will be on the side of good. But for Lee there is symmetry on thejust bello side as well. For a variety of reasons (e.g., military personnel respond to peer pressure to sign up, persistent governmental propaganda convinces them that their government's cause is just, many are drafted against their will) Lee, in effect, says that even those fighting on the unjust side should not be blamed. They need to be given deference as are those fighting on the side of justice.

Lee discusses, with his customary thoroughness, other issues in Ethics and War. These include terrorism, civil war, and issues pertaining to the end and aftermath of war.

In closing, I'd like to add two comments. First, in his discussion of jus ad bellum, it appears that Lee thinks that the human rights paradigm is the only way to accommodate the right of self-defense and humanitarian concerns to the just cause principle. That is putting it too strongly. It may be that he simply thinks his favorite paradigm is the best around. However he thinks about it, it is not clear from his writing that a case cannot also be made for other ways of putting self defense and humanitarian concerns together. Earlier I mentioned the Chinese philosopher Mo Tzu.[3] He argued for the justice of fighting defensive wars and wars of humanity on utilitarian grounds. One acts, he said, from a sense of universal love to help those people who are being oppressed by their rulers as well as from a sense of love to keep one's own people from being victims of aggressors. I assume that contractarians and Kantians could also develop arguments to fuse self-defense and humanitarian concerns together. In other words, it isn't obvious that you need to be committed to the notion of human rights to bring about this fusion. Non-human rights theories probably can get the job done just as well.

Second, Lee's definition of terrorism is suspect. Terrorism, for him, is defined as a policy (or tactic) "of the use of military force that (1) involves deliberate attacks on civilians and civilian targets, (2) in order to terrorize a general population and thereby weaken morale, (3) in order to bring about some political change" (p. 235). This definition may be both too narrow and too broad. Arguably it is too narrow because this tactic can actually be used against any group of people. For example, military recruits, police, and important government officials, could be killed so that others in the victim group will be terrorized and  abandon their posts,which will in turn affect governmental policies. It seems rather arbitrary to insert 'civilians' into the definition. The definition may also be too broad since Lee supposes that it allows him to call sieges, blockades, and the like acts of terrorism. Of course, sieges and blockades involve some terrorizing, as do almost all military tactics. But the main goal of a siege or a blockade is to weaken the enemy so he can no longer resist, not to terrorize him. There is a danger here that if we follow Lee's definition and interpretation of 'terrorism,' all bad acts aimed at civilians will turn out to be acts of terrorism.

As I suggested earlier, this is a fine book. But it is not introductory. Rather it is one to read, and then keep as a reference. I know that I will keep my copy handy so I can get a quick overview of what other philosophers have to say on about a topic, or when I want to remind myself of the distinction between asymmetry on the jus ad bellum side of just war theory and asymmetry in the jus in bello side.

[1] Mo Tzu, Basic Writings, translated by Burton Watson (New York: Columbia University Press, 1963.

[2] Mencius, Works of Mencius, Book 1, Part 1, Chapters 4-7; Part 2, Chapter 8; Book 2, Part 1, Chapters 2-3, in Chinese Classics, James Legge (editor) (Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1894.

[3] Mo Tzu, op. cit., pp. 50-61.