Ethics and Weapons of Mass Destruction

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Sohail H. Hashmi and Steven P. Lee (eds.), Ethics and Weapons of Mass Destruction, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 550pp, $37.99 (pbk), ISBN 05211545269.

Reviewed by Ron Hirschbein, California State University, Chico


Responding to the post-9/11 concern about weapons of mass destruction (WMD), the editors offer a carefully thought out, far-reaching, comparative survey of ethical perspectives regarding the development, deployment, and detonation of chemical, biological, and nuclear weapons. This comprehensive anthology includes perspectives ranging from mainstream political realism to Hindu sensibilities. In so doing, it gives voice to perspectives usually marginalized in discussions of highly lethal, indiscriminate weaponry.

One might well begin by reading the last chapter: Lee's succinct overview of these diverse perspectives. The volume focuses almost exclusively upon the justification of nation-states possessing -- or renouncing -- WMD. Curiously, Lee concludes by entertaining the possibility that the volume may be inadequate due to the terrorist diaspora. To be sure, nation-states no longer have an exclusive franchise on WMD. That said, they remain the primary manufacturers and users of these weapons. To paraphrase Bertrand Russell, for every bomb thrown by a terrorist, a million have been dropped by nation-states. The overarching question posed by the anthology remains painfully relevant: Can the development, deployment, and detonation of WMDs be incorporated into a moral understanding of warfare?

Anthologies often promise a comparative approach, but unfortunately many of the contributions often bypass one another like proverbial ships in the night. Much to their credit, Hashmi and Lee offer a sharply focused, comparative approach in which the diverse contributors address six specific questions. The responses are generally cogent, articulate, and accessible. (Certain readers, however, may be distracted by the filigreed exegesis of certain sacred texts.) Well aware that no author speaks definitively for a tradition, the editors include two chapters from each tradition: one offers a broad overview of the reasoning that informs the six questions; the other articulates controversies within the tradition.

1. What norms govern the use of these weapons, and what are the sources of these norms?

2. Under what circumstances is it permissible to employ WMD?

3. Is the development and deployment of such weapons licit as a deterrent?

4. Is it permissible to deny this weaponry to certain nations?

5. Is WMD disarmament morally imperative?

6. What policies do the diverse ethical traditions entail?

The editors realize that, unlike conventional weapons, WMD get bad press. In their view this is justified since these weapons of putatively limited military value indiscriminately harm civilians. True, as the authors suggest, in theory conventional weapons can be discriminate. However, this is far from inevitable in practice. Not only do "smart" conventional weapons often miss their targets ("smart" cruise missiles recently missed their targets by several countries), they destroy a nation's infrastructure thereby causing long-term harm to the defenseless. Further, Paul Szasz is among the contributors who remind us that mustard gas was used exclusively against military personnel in World War I trench warfare. Moreover, near-genocidal massacres in Cambodia and Rwanda were carried out with primitive conventional weapons. In any case, I doubt that anyone -- civilian or combatant -- feels better knowing that he's dying from shrapnel rather than from poison gas.

Hashmi and Lee close their introduction with a question that troubles (or should trouble) those of us who hazard evaluations of foreign policy and military affairs: What difference -- if any -- do our pronouncements make? They cite the U.S. Catholic Bishops' Pastoral Letter on nuclear policy along with the claims of diverse contributors who claim that moral inhibitions can make a difference in warfare. To indulge in a pessimistic moment, given recent events, any celebration of the triumph of a higher morality in collective life is premature. Indeed, save for the Southern Baptists, every major denomination in the United States urged that Bush Administration not to attack Iraq. Nevertheless, the editors concur with their contributors: "The role ethics play in public policy remains indeterminate and requires much more empirical study." Despite the indeterminate efficacy of our ethical concerns, the editors urge that just as we must not suspend judgment regarding torture and genocide, we must carefully weigh the morality of WMD. The editors do an admirable job of providing the resources to do so. (However, the allusion to torture and genocide seems inappropriate: It seems monstrous to consider the permissible use of torture and genocide, but certain essays in the anthology argue that it is permissible to use WMD in certain situations, especially as a deterrent.) In any case, while decision-makers may not profit from the anthology, academics and advanced students surely would benefit from this well organized, fair-minded, provocative collection.

Given its relevance and controversial nature, the anthology invites -- if not demands -- argumentation: The anthology should provoke animated and productive discussions of jus in bello. Indeed, it is difficult to resist the temptation to enter into such discussions in this review. It is appropriate, at least, to hazard some glosses on the themes that converge as one reflects upon the volume. I begin with my least contentious claim:

¤ Contrary to the realists' claims, no one gets -- to invoke James' good name -- a moral holiday. As Sagan quips rhetorically: "What role do ethics play in statesmen's decision about the acquisition and use of … WMD? Most realists would write an exceedingly short paper … a one-word telegram … 'None."' Invoking the ancient wisdom of Thucydides, classical realists remind us that the strong do what they will; the weak struggle to make the best of it. That said, realism is not informed by a value-free, amoral realpolitk. Like the other contributors, realists presuppose that political actors have free will: There would be no point in discussing ethics if actors could not do other than what they do. True, realists are not advocates of a higher, altruistic morality. But their project is guided by a categorical imperative: Always act to promote the survival of the nation-state and its hegemonic aspirations. Indeed, realists such as Kissinger seldom tire of exhorting statesman to renounce idealism in favor of power politics. Sagan suggests this imperative is best actualized through prudence (not to be mistaken for beneficence). Unvarnished belligerence may prompt adversaries to respond in kind -- not a good thing.

¤ Nevertheless, with the exception of the feminists and pacifists, many of the contributors attempt to take an abbreviated moral holiday by invoking some version of Walzer's "Supreme Emergency" doctrine which somehow renders the suspension of the usual normative inhibitions permissible -- if not "necessary -- amid extraordinary exigencies. The nature of these emergencies is contested. Walzer argues that the omnicidal threat posed by the American nuclear arsenal was necessary to deter Soviet aggression during the Cold War; Shue disagrees. Other such emergencies involve saving Western civilization, or -- depending upon one's tribe -- Buddhist, Muslim, or Hindu civilization. These narratives of necessity presuppose that, in certain circumstances, political actors have no choice. However, the nature of this "necessity" -- one of the most overused and abused terms in international relations -- is never spelled out. I suspect think those who invoke "necessity" do not have logical or empirical constructions in mind. The necessity entailed by supreme emergencies seems like an unthought, unquestioned script in which, somehow, one event must follow another. The script is reified and seen as an obdurate feature of reality.

¤ The pacifists and feminists are not about to take moral holidays even amid supreme emergencies. (Peach may be an exception because her pragmatic pacifism does not rule out the need for group violence a priori.) Indeed, these dissenters find the focus of the volume tendentious. Duane Cady, for example, urges that the notion of ethics and WMD is an oxymoron. Indeed, he fears that parsing fine distinctions about the use -- or threatened use -- of WMDs may de facto legitimize war-fighting with conventional weapons. For the most part, the pacifists and feminists regard forlorn resignation regarding WMD as (to invoke C. Wright Mill's memorable phrase) "crackpot realism": an ideology that legitimizes and perpetuates patriarchal institutions. They remind us that, as the abolition and civil rights movements illustrate, seemingly intractable oppression can be overcome. (Surprisingly, there is no reference to Jonathan Schell's Unconquerable World: an account of the unexpected, nonviolent demise of the Soviet Union and Warsaw Pact.) And yet, it is difficult to embrace Cady's hope that moral appeals will eventually abolish WMDs, if not the scourge of warfare.

¤ None of the contributors is enthusiastic about detonating WMD, but a surprising number lament the need to develop and deploy these weapons for purposes of deterrence. Others suggest that WMD are a blessing in disguise that has ushered in peace on earth without goodwill toward men. Many of these authors are aware of the paradoxes that bedevil deterrence doctrine: As critical pacifists such as Holmes argue, it is disingenuous, if not contradictory, to claim that one intends to use nuclear weapons as a deterrent, but never use them in practice. As he reminds us, to truly intend is be prepared to act upon the intention in the appropriate circumstances. Nevertheless, advocates of deterrence argue that the doctrine may not work in theory, but it works in practice. However, as the feminists and pacifists urge, many factors might explain why the US/USSR rivalry didn't foment a world war during the time of the bipolar disorder. For example, deterrence theorists don't entertain the possibility that (with the exception of the brief Allied invasion of Vladivostok in 1919) there is simply no precedent for war between the superpowers.

¤ A more contentious criticism emerges when I consider Lee's brief conclusion. He asserts that the chapters reveal the relevance of diverse traditions to the moral challenges posed by WMD. I disagree. Lee presents an over-determined view of the role of these traditions in shaping jus in bello discourse. Evidently, there are no seamless traditions. The anthology covers a remarkable and worthwhile diversity of secular and sectarian perspectives. However, the respective authors' analyses of WMD don't follow from the tradition that putatively informs their views. Indeed, many of the authors begin with a literature review that reveals that their respective positions are beset by contradictory exhortations regarding the justification and conduct of war. We quickly discover that most traditions privilege just war perspectives while marginalizing pacifist and holy war doctrines. More telling still, with the exception of the pacifists and certain feminists, the contributors advocate strikingly similar positions irrespective of their traditions. Given these times, Hashmi's learned account of Muslim thinking may be of special interest. However, there are no shocks or surprises. While contemporary Muslim scholarship has little to say regarding the conduct of war, a familiar just war doctrine emerged from the ancient jurists' exegesis of the sacred texts. Hashmi is very much in accord with many of the other contributors.

¤ More contentious still, the project is informed by Foundationalism. With the notable exception of Peach's essay on pragmatic feminism, the editors and contributors presuppose that their views require the imprimatur of a time-honored tradition. But what shall we conclude from the realization that many authors arrive at the same perspective regardless of their tradition? To invoke Nietzsche's bad name, perhaps philosophy is self-confession. Could it be that many contributors reach the same conclusions because they are members of the same tribe -- the academic subculture? In any case, it appears that the authors' views on WMD bear little relationship to their putative perspectives. True, one does not expect a sturdy, deductive strategy of argumentation that would please the likes of Hempel. But I sense a lack of logical, empirical, and normative connections between venerable traditions and the contradictory prescriptions that emerge regarding WMD.

Why -- to broach a shamelessly rhetorical question -- must I look backward to a time-honored tradition to justify what I value? If I love a woman, must I bestow the imprimatur of some highly regarded foundation to justify this passion and commitment? Imagine justifying my final, erotic vocabulary by invoking Aristotelian virtue ethics, Kantian duty, or Benthamite icy-cold calculation. If I love the idea of a more peaceful planet above other political considerations, must I seek the imprimatur of a venerable tradition? Conversely, if I honor my tribe above all else, must I seek some justification in holy writ? To continue this rather tendentious line of questioning: Why must academics look backward to time-honored traditions to justify their existential commitments? To be sure, given the accomplishments of these authors, their preferences are no doubt the results of serious inquiry and reflection, not the products caprice and whimsy. I doubt, however, that their positions are determined solely by the traditions they espouse.

Like Rorty, Peach's pragmatic feminism challenges this backward-looking emphasis on foundationalism that informs many of the contributions. A pragmatic, forward-looking approach to minimizing the danger posed by WMD (a goal all contributors share) would eschew high-sounding abstractions and celestial principles in favor of modest, experimental projects that might produce incremental changes. In any case, given my biases, an anti-foundationalist or existential perspective would be a welcomed addition to this otherwise comprehensive and challenging anthology.