Ethics as a Work of Charity: Thomas Aquinas and Pagan Virtue

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David Decosimo, Ethics as a Work of Charity: Thomas Aquinas and Pagan Virtue, Stanford University Press, 2014, 354pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804790635.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hause, Creighton University


Two Marxist professors from Cornell were once discussing a libertarian graduate student in their department. The first asserted that, after the revolution, he would have the student executed. The second thought this judgment too hasty. He noted, without humor or irony, that he would instead put the matter to a vote of the workers. Either course would see the problem summarily dispatched, "dealt with." A less brutal, more charitable attitude would envision those who think other than we do, those outside our political or religious communities, not as problems to be dealt with, but as human beings to be engaged. If we take this more charitable route, however, how do we learn from, form friendships with, and find community with those we disagree with so profoundly without losing our own identity or compromising our own principles?

David Decosimo proposes Thomas Aquinas as a model for us to follow in addressing these concerns. Aquinas identified as part of the community of western, orthodox Christianity, and for him everyone else was in some sense an outsider. Decosimo argues that Aquinas nevertheless treated outsiders with charity. While he would not pass as especially welcoming in our age, he stood out in his. For instance, he spoke out against at least some of the brutal repression and injustice inflicted on the Jews, and he treated certain ancient pagan philosophers as guides and perhaps even as friends. In all these cases, he looked to the best in those he considered 'outsiders' and succeeded in finding community with them. One basis for community is that, in Aquinas's view, many non-Christians seek what is genuinely good as their final end, and they develop true virtue that enables them to pursue that final good. While some Aquinas scholars have found this idea plainly false, since Aquinas clearly takes the final good to be a relationship with the Trinity of divine persons. Decosimo argues by contrast that it is precisely Aquinas's Trinitarian and Christocentric theology that grounds his view that non-Christians, too, pursue a genuine final good through true virtue. In Decosimo's view, Aquinas does not need to compromise his Christian identity to welcome outsiders; rather, it is his vision of Christianity that impels him to welcome them.

One important thesis of Ethics as a Work of Charity is that human beings without the grace that bestows charity can nevertheless have true virtue. Decosimo argues for this thesis throughout the book, but nowhere so forcefully as in chapters 4 and 5. One might have thought the thesis had no need of defense, since Aquinas states explicitly that human beings can develop moral virtues without charity, just as many pagans had done (ST I-II 65.2). However, the issue is not so simple because Aquinas says in the same passage that these character traits are only virtues in a certain respect, not virtues absolutely speaking. Decosimo's strategy for resolving the problem combines a close reading of the text with an astute eye for the details of the account of virtue that Aquinas builds over the whole of his later career. It is true that these virtues we acquire without charity are only virtues in a certain respect, but that claim implies chiefly that they are conducive to an end that is final only in a certain respect, that is, the sort of happiness one can attain naturally. However, even those who have charity need to acquire these virtues if they are to enjoy the goodness of this life as fully as they can (151-2). In fact, these acquired virtues fully satisfy the criteria Aquinas sets out for virtue in his detailed account: they are stable and reliable, conducive only to what is good, and unified through prudence. Decosimo's treatment of this issue is thoroughly convincing and should put to rest the controversy over whether those without charity can have genuine moral virtue.

One source of confusion over this issue is that Aquinas sometimes speaks only of infused virtue as "true" virtue. Aquinas notoriously maintains that humans are capable of not only the sort of moral virtues developed through habituation in the way that Aristotle explains, but also of receiving a different sort of moral virtue as a gift from God. We may therefore have not only an acquired courage, the product of long training in the face of frightening and difficult challenges that we have overcome by control of fear and confidence, but also infused courage, which results from divine grace. Decosimo rightly observes that in different contexts, Aquinas uses expressions such as 'true virtue' or 'perfect virtue' to establish different conclusions (115-19). In contending that 'true' virtue is the infused rather than the acquired variety, Aquinas means simply that infused virtue leads to the complete and perfect good that is God, while acquired virtue perfects us for the limited final good we can attain in this world. Despite their limitation, this final good and its associated virtues are still bona honesta, that is, noble or fine goods, which are goods that are directible to the unlimited final good that is God. Decosimo concludes that the acquired virtues are directible to the ultimate final good through the mediation of the infused virtues. For this reason, in someone with the gift of grace, the acquired virtues will serve the ends of charity. Through this reading, Decosimo explains one sense of the common Thomistic dictum that grace builds upon nature. He also explains why Aquinas, precisely because of his religious commitments, finds acquired virtue praiseworthy and admirable.

In chapter 8, Decosimo calls attention to an odd and puzzling passage from ST II-II 23.7 ad 1. There, Aquinas explains that, when a single agent who lacks charity directs her act to her final end, she might do what is good by nature or, by contrast, direct her act to infidelitas and thereby sin. What exactly it means to direct one's acts to infidelitas, and how it is possible for a single agent to do either what is (imperfectly) good or what is sinful by pursuing her final end, Aquinas leaves undiscussed. To answer these questions, Decosimo reconstructs a solution that, while speculative, is highly plausible, thanks to its roots in Aquinas's philosophical and theological commitments. Although Aquinas often speaks of our ultimate end through monolithic formulae ("the vision of God" or "life according to reason"), our conception of that end includes a plurality of beliefs about what constitutes that end. In some cases, an agent may be guided by some true beliefs conducive to genuine goods, while in others she may be guided by the false beliefs that constitute her infidelitas. Since one's final end conception has a certain unifying structure to it, it is a single final end conception that guides her whether she aims at a genuine good or at infidelitas. In some cases, certain beliefs in one's final end conception are salient and others are not, and it is this salience that determines whether one aims at a good or at infidelitas. In the course of refining this account, Decosimo distinguishes various forms of infidelitas, concluding that even if infidelitas is among one's motivating factors, one's act is not necessarily bad. If his ingenious reading is correct, then Aquinas certainly counts as one of the most generous-minded of medieval thinkers, even if he falls short of what today would pass for generosity of mind.

In addition to its many excellences, Decosimo's book also contains a few questionable claims and poorly substantiated arguments. He admirably defends Aquinas against charges that he played a central role in the harassment and persecution of the Jews (21-34). Those accusations are based on thoroughly shoddy scholarship. Instead, Decosimo sees in Aquinas someone who supported full freedom of worship for the non-Christians of his era. However, he also recognizes that Aquinas's reason for allowing this freedom is that otherwise worse evils might ensue. Hence, Aquinas's advocacy for religious freedom stems not from any respect for freedom of worship but from a fear of civil unrest or public insecurity. Decosimo, who wants us to see Aquinas in an admirable light, contrasts this "pragmatic" line of thought with what he calls "his principled proscription of compulsion in II.II 10.8" (281, note 56). However, what is proscribed in that article is not interference with the free worship of non-Christians, but rather forcing non-Christians to submit to Christianity. It is therefore far from clear that Aquinas anywhere expressed a principled respect for freedom of worship. Nor do I see much justification for Decosimo's claim that Aquinas "shows deep respect for Muslims" (36). His first basis for this claim is that Muslims "are to be addressed as full members of the community of reason-givers" (36). This may constitute respect, but of a minimal sort at best. Decosimo continues by noting that Aquinas does not simply quote Christian scripture at Muslims, but rather engages them in argument not based on scripture to try to point out their errors. But neither is this practice a sign of deep respect. It is, after all, the only pragmatic way to convince someone who does not share the Christian Bible that he or she holds erroneous views.

When he turns to the formation and function of moral habits, Decosimo's study relies on several questionable arguments. He asserts, for instance, that in On the Virtues in General 9 ad 13, Aquinas asserts that "virtue is caused by acts at once virtuous and vicious" (306, note 27). What Aquinas actually writes is that the acts that cause virtue are "virtuous in one way and not virtuous in another." Decosimo makes the unwarranted inference that any act that is not virtuous is vicious, so that even continent acts would count as vicious in a way. In addition, he claims that in the body of article 9, Aquinas says that virtue in the sensitive appetite is obedient not to reason, but only to right reason (128-29). Aquinas does not explicitly assert this claim, but Decosimo assumes he must hold it because otherwise a virtue would not lead to good any more than to bad action. However, the claim that virtue follows only right reason leaves Aquinas's moral psychology mysterious. How does a virtue in the sensitive appetite "know" that reason is right or erroneous? The account of virtue that Decosimo attributes to Aquinas would be more plausible if he could explain how a non-rational faculty could achieve so astounding an accomplishment. Finally, Decosimo asserts that so-called 'imperfect' or 'unconnected virtue' "actually contains the seeds of its own destruction" (165). After all, only true virtues bring stable and obedient desires. Someone with merely imperfect virtues will suffer from wayward and inconsistent desires that will corrupt practical reason, even in the domain of one's imperfect virtues. As a result, those very virtues will be destroyed. However, this argument is entirely too hasty. First, imperfect virtue is sometimes natural to a person and therefore very stable. Second, even if one acquires an imperfect virtue without other habits to make one's actions prompt and pleasurable, one could still be continent and therefore suffer no corruption of practical reason. Perhaps one might fail occasionally, but so do virtuous people, according to Aquinas. Even if Decosimo could argue convincingly that even continence is not stable, that would not show that imperfect virtue contains the seeds of its own destruction. Such virtue would be destroyed, if at all, by the corrupting effects of wayward desire on practical reason, not by anything internal to the imperfect virtue itself.

While Ethics as a Work of Charity contains many close readings and strives to settle any number of textual disputes, it is not at all a pedantic work. Its chief virtue lies in the thoughtful and imaginative use to which it puts these careful readings. Decosimo adopts a spirit that he finds in Aquinas himself, one that combines an insistence on attentiveness with an even greater insistence on charity. As a result, Decosimo puts his considerable philosophical skills to work in articulating a full and sophisticated account of habit, virtue, and human happiness drawn chiefly from Aquinas's mature writings. While I have doubts that Aquinas emerges as one of the better models we should follow in thinking about how to understand and live with those who are our 'outsiders', Decosimo succeeds in establishing the creative ways in which a spirit of charity can overcome barriers to community.