Ethics at the Beginning of Life: A Phenomenological Critique

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James Mumford, Ethics at the Beginning of Life: A Phenomenological Critique, Oxford University Press, 2013, 212pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673964.

Reviewed by Paolo Monti, Università Cattolica del Sacro Cuore


Ethical concerns surrounding the first stages of human life are among the most debated issues in moral philosophy, to the point of being, in the perception of the wider public, a paradigm of our deepest unresolved cultural disagreements, particularly between secular and religious perspectives.

James Mumford seems both well aware of and substantially dissatisfied with the state of this debate, and it is not difficult for the reader to share his intent to deal with the subject while trying to move beyond the stale, fruitless features of the intellectual contraposition that surrounds it. While Mumford's views are not presented as 'neutral' and the book appears in the Oxford University Press series on Theological Ethics, the argument is mainly philosophical and it constantly avoids the risk of becoming a partisan statement. Rather, Mumford tries to offer a documented, well-thought-out contribution by focusing the moral inquiry on the phenomenon at stake. In this sense, the phenomenological approach is not just a choice of method or a philosophical school, but rather an apt perspective from which to see what is lacking in the current debate: attention to the peculiar way human life begins within the womb of another human being.

Chapter 1 is devoted mostly to presenting the phenomenological tradition, with its major figures and features. Here, Merleau-Ponty's perspective introduces us to the specific view of the phenomenologist: a philosophical proposition to go back to the things themselves and how they present themselves in our experience. In a sense, phenomenology acts as an antidote against both the pervasive influence of concepts from the natural sciences and social theory and the consequences of Idealism, which, after Descartes and Kant, detached our representation of consciousness from its world. While phenomenology correctly stresses the relevance of the body in how we experience ourselves and others, it also has been much more concerned with death than with birth. However, the fact that humans come from other human bodies is quite relevant. We are objects in wombs before being subjects, long before being aware and experiencing. On the other hand, the "newone", as Mumford says, is already in the experience of the mother.

Mumford follows this line of reasoning, drawing from Iris Marion Young and Julia Kristeva, offering an account of pregnancy as an experience of both the clear otherness of the newcomer and the structural, hidden intimacy with her, a perspective that only women, as mothers, can have. Outside of this first-person perspective, the foetus often is regarded as an independent object inside a womb or, at the opposite end of the spectrum, as an extension of the mother. In this scenario, the main questions of the book can arise: What is at stake in this peculiar and extraordinary encounter between the mother and this newcomer? What are the ethical implications? In Mumford's account, two views about the essence of human encounters obscure the ground we need to see the answers to these questions.

Mumford faces these two views in Chapters 2 and 3. Chapter 2 focuses on the thought of Martin Buber and the Philosophy of Dialogue, taken as a paradigmatic theoretical approach to human encounters. Mumford considers the 'I and Thou' approach to be a significant innovation. However, he also argues that the sharp separation between the 'I-Thou' and the 'I-It' paradigms, as opposed models for understanding human experiences and interactions, proves misleading when it comes to the special kind of encounter that happens in pregnancy. By radically contrasting the subject-object posture with the subject-subject one, Buber characterized any 'true' interpersonal relationship as mutual and reciprocal, with a clear axiological priority assigned to this kind of relationship over the objectual model. As a result, all kinds of human interaction that do not meet the high standards of that demanding ideal are belittled. The peculiar relationship between the mother and the creature in her womb is no exception.

Mumford notes that, under pressure of critiques he received from Gabriel Marcel, Franz Rosenzweig and Emmanuel Levinas, Buber partially amended and rectified the most undesirable, extreme consequences of his polarized view. On the other hand, Mumford also remarks that authors like Karl Barth relied on the most basic, rough characterization of Buber's work, thus spreading its most misleading implications through a distinct idealization of the qualities of interpersonal encounters, here characterized as "hyper-Buberian" (56). It is in these extreme forms that the Philosophy of Dialogue seems to conceal the personal status of the encounter that is at the core of the experience of pregnancy.

In Chapter 3, Mumford addresses another conceptual screen that he argues historically has concealed the depth of the phenomenon of human emergence by obscuring "the fundamental contingency or fortuitousness of the 'original encounter'" (79). It is the Contract model, which has so widely influenced the Modern, liberal conception of encounters and practical dealings among humans.

Mumford considers the 17th century as the beginning of the Modern era and devotes special attention to Locke, whose thought is seen as an emblematic shift toward a conception of society in which self-preservation plays a pivotal role in defining the individual and trade becomes the paradigm of basic social relationships. Locke is relevant insofar as he transforms a fundamental anthropological thesis from Hobbes into a different conception of human interactions, modelled by the mercantile ideal of contract-regulated exchanges among self-interested actors. This conception projects a specific image of humans and their relationships in which the process of deliberation "essentially combines the ability to compute one's own self-interest with (again) an awareness of how the other is likely to compute theirs" (91).

Thus, the kind of encounter that the contractual model sets is arranged and regulated between willing agents who are identical when it comes to their fundamental capabilities. However, this way, "the Contract model 'holds us captive' by neglecting our fundamental context in the world" (96). Here, the main thesis is that the modern depiction of our human condition is essentially individualistic and antisocial. While many critics of Modernity have supported this thesis in various ways, here, the focus is mostly on the Heidegger of Being and Time and his characterization of the subject as a 'being-in-the-world' who also is 'being-with', concluding that "before we are agents in the world we are subject to it" (100) and we are there with others. It is in this context that, going beyond Heidegger, Mumford frames the phenomenon of human emergence as an original situation of kinship, in which the human being always is thrown into the world in a particular context and in total dependency. Therefore, the Modern, paradigmatic representation of individuals as fully informed, autonomous agents in contractual relationships is the expression of a "forgetfulness of Becoming" (118), a view that is oblivious of its inescapably dependent origin.

Chapter 4 opens the second part of the book, the aim of which is to move from phenomenological critique of various models of encounter that have obfuscated human emergence to the ethical implications of a renewed phenomenological account of that emergence. Mumford argues that the crucial opening move of an ethical account lies in defining boundaries. Who is entitled to be recognized as a moral subject and, thus, protected by a right to live? The answer to this question is rooted in some conception of human recognition. Here, again, two theories are taken to be potentially misleading when applied to the phenomenon of emergent human life: the theory based on empathy and the one based on capacities.

Even if Edith Stein's famous characterization of empathy, building on Husserl, is correctly acknowledged for being nuanced and accounting for various levels of non-reciprocity and disparity between subjects, Mumford thinks that her approach still cannot be applied to cases in which the interlocutor is hidden and unavailable. Similarly, even if thinkers like Bartolomé Las Casas or Immanuel Kant argued from the rational capacities of human beings to defend their equality and dignity regardless of race, customs and class, that approach would miss how those capacities can become thresholds that exclude some from recognition. Moreover, Mumford argues, the peculiar features of the early stages of human life reveal that the development of those capacities "is often dependent upon interaction with others" (147). This observation weakens the Modern conception of our rational capacities as a fixed measure of the humanity of the individual rather than as an emergent phenomenon that may come to be only if it is accepted and recognized by someone else.

Chapter 5 moves beyond the issue of recognition to explore further territories in the ethical landscape. Beyond recognition and, thus, beyond the establishment of the moral status of the subjects at stake, there is the issue of circumstances and reasons for action that may justify acts against those subjects, regardless of their status.

Against Judith Jarvis Thomson's famous essay, "A Defense of Abortion," Mumford does not argue by questioning the moral reasoning behind it, but rather by discussing the phenomenological picture that makes such an argument relevant and persuasive. Framing abortion as an act of self-defence of the mother, with death of the newone as an unintended consequence, would imply that we accepted a depiction of human emergence as an 'invasion' rather than an encounter. Mumford argues that, on the basis of the phenomenological inquiry presented in previous chapters, this depiction seems plausible exclusively in those cases where the life of the mother is put in danger by her pregnancy. The problem is that such a depiction is commonly applied to every pregnancy, with dubious moral implications. Another problem is that by following that line of reasoning, we miss the ability to understand properly encounters that are unequal because of the subject's characteristics and the circumstances of the interaction, since in some way "any person who is radically dependent upon another individual can be viewed as an intruder" (174). Therefore, dependence is represented as a form of harm, when it is actually one of the most defining and crucial features of the human condition.

Chapter 6 constitutes the third and last part of the book. Mumford offers a personal perspective on the possible foundation of basic human rights on the Christian normative concept of Imago Dei as elaborated by Gregory of Nazianzus in reference to the disgraced condition of lepers. Under this paradigm, recognition and ascription of human rights do not come from possessing certain capacities or from membership in our species, but rather from a view of personality as something that transcends the current natural state of a human being. Mumford argues that the roots of personality can be recognized within the peculiar human kinship that brought all of us to life and whose sense can be seen only from a wider perspective about what we might eventually be in the future and even, theologically, in God's view. Therefore, ascription of rights is grounded in the absolute value of being a unique individual, a condition that already is shared by the newone in the mother's womb, despite lack of capabilities and a personality hidden from any chance of a mature, reciprocal encounter.

To assess Mumford's work, it is safe to start by saying that his reasoning throughout the book is quite perceptive and respectful in debating his philosophical and theological interlocutors. I will point out two instances where his remarks seem less persuasive.

The first instance is Edith Stein's account of empathy. Mumford is correct in pointing out that the empathy approach requires a certain level of pairing, or identification, between the two subjects, and that this premise pushes towards a normative expectation of equality, mutuality and reciprocity. However, it also must be said that the various degrees of pairing that Stein allows for could include the level of identification that an adult can have with the body of a newone who is coming into life. It seems plausible if, as Mumford suggests elsewhere, our understanding of ourselves and of the other is permeated by awareness of our own 'becoming', of our being subject to time. The foetus' state of being hidden, unconscious and developing is one we can grasp because of our experiences of being unaware and defenceless or because of our memories of childhood as a time of dependency. Here, Mumford seems on good ground while arguing against contemporary application of the empathy approach, like in Tzvetan Todorov, Richard Rorty and Raimond Gaita. It is more dubious that Stein's insightful, nuanced view is a proper target for this kind of critique.

The second instance is Mumford's acceptance of Thomson's picture when a pregnancy threatens the life of the mother. I do not argue here over the normative outcome, but rather over acceptance of the way the case is construed. Even if the life of the mother is at stake, can the situation really be construed as an attack? An attack from whom? On the basis of what agency? Isn't it, rather, a risk, a perilous process? Since there is no intentionality from the newone that brings about the dangerous situation, it seems difficult, given Mumford's original characterization of that peculiar encounter, to interpret it as an outright attack, unless in a very shifted and, thus, debatable sense.

In general, Mumford's book is not only a very interesting contribution to the debate on the ethics of the beginning of life, but it is also an excellent example of scholarship on Continental philosophy. The writing is accessible and informative for various types of readers, with abundant and precise references to authors of various philosophical and theological traditions. The scope and depth of Mumford's references to the phenomenological literature are particularly commendable, thanks to the competent use of the classics as well as more recent authors and to keeping both the German and French sides of the debate in mind. Maybe some more space could have been given to Hannah Arendt's thought: while her views are mentioned, a more specific focus on her use of the concept of 'natality' in The Human Condition would have been appropriate given the thematic context. Quotations and references are generally appropriate and useful, even if in some cases so many texts appearing on the same page proves slightly disorienting.

Perhaps the least satisfactory part of the book is the conclusion, which presents a final critique of the liberal views on human emergence as a sharp alternative between a religious theory of recognition and a Nietzschean model centred on the role of power in social relationships. There would have been room for more development and discussion, but the argument is only sketched. However, Mumford certainly opened that room for others to step into and further the conversation. In this sense, the book is successful and largely worthy of careful consideration by all those interested in the topic. Our consolidated conceptual frames have a tendency to conceal some aspects of our most fundamental encounters with reality. As Mumford points out, our refined, abstract intellectual debates sometimes fail "to do justice to the world" (102). In this sense, the phenomenological tradition has much to contribute, and essays like this one, from scholars well versed in both Continental and Analytical tradition, can prove essential to putting the inquiry on a better track.