Ethics at the Cinema

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Ward E. Jones and Samantha Vice (eds.), Ethics at the Cinema, Oxford University Press, 2011, 341pp., ISBN 9780195320398.

Reviewed by Diane Jeske, University of Iowa


In recent years there has been a seeming explosion of philosophical works dealing with film and its relationship to philosophy. Some of these works explore philosophical questions about the nature of film, while others use films as springboards for philosophical enquiry. Ethics at the Cinema, an anthology edited by Ward E. Jones and Samantha Vice, brings together essays that do both, i.e., what we can think of as philosophy of film and what we can think of as philosophy through film. Part One ("Critique, Character, and the Power of Film") deals with the former, while Part Two ("Philosophical Readings") deals with the latter, although, inevitably, the two projects often overlap.

Each of the authors who contributed to the volume was asked to choose a single film about which to write. The range of films chosen is quite striking, from the 1940s British "propaganda" film The Life and Death of Colonel Blimp to the recent less-than-memorable American comedy Fools Rush In. Not really surprising to my mind is the fact that three of the authors chose to write about Carol Reed's great 1940s British noir thriller The Third Man, given that the film is, I believe, a fascinating and provocative study in moral choice and friendship. I will discuss these three essays in more detail later in this review.

Reviewing an anthology of this nature always poses certain challenges, given the range of themes addressed by the various authors. Inevitably, some of the authors have made better use of their chosen films than have others. There is always a danger that philosophers will use very slight material from a film as an opportunity to discuss issues that are of interest to them. After all, our work colors our thought to the extent that almost any artistic work can trigger philosophical reflection on our part. This is not necessarily a bad thing, but it can lead to philosophical writing in which the use of a film is more distracting than helpful. On the whole, however, the contributors to Ethics at the Cinema have written interesting and engaging articles that either provoked me to think more deeply about films that I had already seen (and, in several cases, had completely different takes on than the authors did) or made me want to see the films discussed.

For example, Murray Smith's "Just What Is It That Makes Tony Soprano Such an Appealing, Attractive Murderer?" has stirred in me a desire to watch the television series The Sopranos, which I have until now avoided due to my dislike of mafia films/TV shows. Smith's essay addresses the question "how can we care about, or sympathize with, someone who would repel us in reality?" (69). Smith's answer is twofold: there are aspects of Tony Soprano, mobster, with which we can identify, which make him one of us, and, at the same time, he has the power to engage in the sorts of transgressions of moral and legal norms about which we, for better or worse, only fantasize when we are frustrated or angry.

Ward E. Jones uses His Girl Friday to address a very similar issue, namely our amusement at "transgressive actions -- that is, the kind of events that would, in many other, easily imaginable instances, appropriately bring about very different kinds of responses" (92). These are cases in which we laugh "at acts of violence, abuse, or cruelty" (92). I immediately think of the scene in Pulp Fiction in which John Travolta's thug character accidently blows the head off of a passenger in the back seat of the car, a scene during which I found myself laughing quite uncontrollably while feeling a distinct sense of unease at my own amusement. Jones's thesis is that "A person's being amused at something is significantly correlated with the person's partiality toward or away from certain features of the humorous situation" (100). And here casting in films is all-important: it is significant that the relevant transgressive actions in His Girl Friday are performed by the character portrayed by Cary Grant. (Just as it is significant that the villain of The Third Man, Harry Lime, is portrayed by Orson Welles.) A less charismatic and charming actor would make the film a very different work insofar as our sympathies would likely be quite different.

These two essays together represent, I believe, the best sort of work involving film and philosophy, because they raise ethical questions about our viewing of films that then raise parallel questions about our responses to real people in our lives. Our modes of viewing -- the ways that we situate people and events in a context, the aspects of a person upon which we focus or to which we respond, our own background hopes that we perhaps unwittingly bring to bear in assessment -- both in real-life and with respect to film affect our judgments and, often, our actions and other responses. Bringing these modes of viewing to conscious attention and reflection is important for ethical judgment and choice, because we need to be able to assess our 'takes' on events, actions, and actors before reacting in morally charged situations. Moral wisdom requires an ability to turn objects of evaluation this way and that, to put them against larger or different backgrounds, and these activities require imagination, a capacity enhanced by both philosophy and art.

Modes of viewing play a crucial role in interpreting and learning from a complex film such as The Third Man, a film addressed by three of the essays in Ethics at the Cinema. Placing these essays together offers a fascinating glimpse of the different ways in which characters and plots can be understood. At the heart of the film is the relationship between Holly Martins (played by Joseph Cotton) and Harry Lime (Orson Welles). But how are we to understand that relationship? Julia Driver, in "Justice, Mercy, and Friendship in The Third Man," sees Holly and Harry as being genuine friends, but she also, correctly in my view, sees the film as showing the dangers of not widening one's critical perspective beyond the partiality demanded by friendship: whereas Holly is eventually able to widen his perspective, Harry's lover Anna is never able to do so and thus becomes a vivid exemplar of loyalty taken beyond its appropriate limits. On the other hand, Deborah Knight, in "The Third Man: Ethics, Aesthetics, Irony," asserts that in the course of the film, Holly comes to realize that Harry never was his friend, and, thus, that he owes nothing to Harry. Given their different understandings of the relationship between Holly and Harry, Driver and Martin are forced to understand the penultimate scene of the film, in which Holly kills Harry, quite differently: whereas Driver sees Holly as engaged in a 'mercy killing,' Knight sees Holly as still being naïve enough to be manipulated by Harry's charm.

This brings us to the interpretation of Holly's character: is he a naïve American unequipped to deal with the complexities of post-war Europe, as Knight suggests, or is he a man trying to come to grips with the competing moral demands he finds himself facing, as is suggested by Thomas Wartenberg in "Moral Intelligence and the Limits of Loyalty: The Third Man as Philosophy"? Wartenberg argues that, as a film, The Third Man is able to provide in visual terms the evidence that Holly requires to offset his loyalty to Lime. I think that this is an interesting point, because if we understand loyalty as a demand of friendship, then we will see friends as requiring greater epistemic certitude before they are willing to accept a friend as doing evil. Carol Reed bombards the screen with evidence of Lime's wrong-doing just as the British major Calloway bombards Holly with the evidence. There is a brilliant scene in the film, ably discussed by Wartenberg, in which Calloway takes Holly to the hospital ward to see the children affected by Lime's profiteering in diluted penicillin. We never actually see the children, but we do see a nurse tossing out a teddy bear, thereby driving home to us how Harry has preyed on the innocent, thus taking us, along with Holly, beyond Harry's charm to his callous evil-doing and its consequences.

While the anthology is not really either broad enough or focused enough to serve as a classroom text, instructors teaching courses relating ethics and film would be well-served to take a look at the offerings in the volume. For those of us interested in both ethics and film, there is enough that is engaging and provocative in the book to warrant its perusal. Ethics is an area of philosophy that demands the use of rich and detailed narratives, and so it behooves moral philosophers to attend to the uses to which they can put artistic works such as film and literature. Ethics at the Cinema is a nice addition to the growing ranks of works that attempt to do just that.