Ethics at the End of Life: New Issues and Arguments

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John K. Davis (ed.), Ethics at the End of Life: New Issues and Arguments, Routledge, 2017, 254pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138829756.

Reviewed by Anthony Wrigley, Keele University


John K. Davis' edited collection on the theme of ethics at the end of life provides us with fourteen newly written chapters, many from names that those familiar with this area will doubtless recognise. The book has four Parts, each covering a general topic area in end of life ethics: the nature of death; who should make end of life decisions; means of ending life; and the role of other parties at the end of life. Individual chapters then address specific topics that fall under the more general theme of the Part in which they are contained. There is no general editorial discussion or introduction for each Part but Davis does provide a short introduction to the book as a whole, presenting a brief but useful summary of the central arguments offered by each author. Each chapter also opens with a short summary.

Although most of the issues cover well-trodden ground, this should not necessarily be seen as a point of criticism as to the usefulness or merits of the collection. The approach the work takes allows the space and scope for many of the individual authors to provide the reader with an excellent survey and up-to-date analysis of the debate in some of the most important topics in this field. That being said, by taking the approach that each of the fourteen chapters must contribute to one of the four general topics corresponding to each Part, there is a notable lack of discussion of some of the issues that have arisen in end of life ethics that fall outside these four basic themes. For example, while we have five chapters in Part I devoted to questions of the nature of death itself there is little covering work on dying as an experience or as a process. I have in mind here topics such as hope and dying or what might make for a good death. Along a similar vein, there is little addressing how we should consider important social questions on end of life care, such as justice concerns surrounding resource allocation to the dying (albeit that some questions are raised in the final chapter by Colin Farrelly concerning justice and ageing, but this is only peripherally about end of life per se), or the use of care pathways as a means of guiding care.

For an edited collection with the subtitle 'New Issues and Arguments' there may, therefore, be a certain level of disappointment for the reader, since 'new' might perhaps be more cautiously read as 'newly written for this volume'. Greater representation from authors based in countries with well-developed palliative care systems outside of the USA, such as the UK, Australia, Belgium and the Netherlands, might have allowed further insight into what contemporary issues are currently being addressed at the cutting edge of practice. However, to overly emphasise this aspect is to partly miss the point of the collection. Not only does it strive to provide us with a clear insight into what some of the fundamental issues in this area are but, in doing so, many of the chapters also indicate new directions and lines of argument that could be taken to address some of these long-standing issues. So, while we get a collection that gives us some excellent state of the art accounts of key areas, we also get (within the limited space each chapter has to work with) a move forward into new territory. Moreover, there are amongst all this chapters that do offer us considerable amounts of new food for thought. For example, Bruce Jennings' 'Solidarity Near the End of Life' is part of a new wave of work in biomedical ethics making use of the concept of solidarity. Given the number of chapters and breadth of work, I will focus on just a few for direct comment.

Part I contains the single largest number of chapters devoted to a theme in the edition -- the connection between end of life ethics and philosophical issues about death -- and takes up over one third of the entire volume. This in itself gives us further insight into the nature of the edition as a whole, where the focus appears to be on more abstractly philosophical concerns than those that might directly relate to practical ethical decision-making at end of life. Most of the chapters in this section speak directly to the most dominant critical concern when discussing the nature of death in end of life ethics: namely, the Epicurean point that death may not be bad for the person who dies.

Take the first of these chapters, 'Is it Possible to Be Better Off Dead?'. Here, Geoffrey Scarre, argues that there are, indeed, circumstances where a person may be better off dead but generalisations that attempt to establish this are unlikely to be convincing. Instead, they should be the preserve of highly subjective value judgements of the individual so concerned. Scarre swiftly rejects the old Epicurean claim, that death cannot be good or bad for the person who dies because they no longer exist to experience any positive or negative effects from it, in order to focus on what sorts of conditions might we understand that someone was better off dead. This is primarily addressed through the question of whether someone has a life worth living, understood by how a person sees their place in the world. For Scarre, this also means that it is not merely medical contexts that these questions arise in, but also where a person may find the prospect of a continued life runs contrary to their values. As such value judgements are so subjective and dependent upon an individual's personal commitments, Scarre argues these are the sorts of judgements that can only be made by the individual themselves. Such a hugely individualistic pro-autonomy position is nothing new. What is needed is some subsequent debate on the wider-reaching implications of it, such as cases concerning assessments of those who are no longer competent. That might have tested the limitations of holding such a position when it comes to end of life scenarios. Nevertheless, one's appetite is whetted as to why even such ancient debates can still be so ethically stimulating.

Chapters 2, 3 and 4 all continue to discuss this Epicurean issue of whether death can be harmful for the one who dies. Taylor W. Cyr's 'How Does Death Harm the Deceased?' offers us a splendid summary of the arguments surrounding the deprivation account of the harm of death and the Epicurean challenges to that position, drawing on Thomas Nagel's responses to four main Epicurean arguments. Benjamin Mitchell-Yellin considers the role of the afterlife in thinking about death and, also taking a cue from Nagel, rejects concerns about the nature of immortality as being of primary importance in these matters. Then we have Jens Johansson's discussion of how bad death might be for any particular person by offering a defence of the deprivation account of the severity of death (that death is bad for a person to the extent that they would have been better off had they not died) against several major objections.

The last chapter of this Part finishes it off on a slightly different tack with Davis' discussion that recognises we should not simply discuss whether death is bad or not without also establishing what death is. Out of four major possible definitions (integrated function, auto-integrated function, personhood, and sentience definitions), Davis argues for a form of the sentience definition of death and that we should adopt a criterion that would take death to be determined by the irreversible cessation of all higher brain functions. Although addressing a somewhat parochial concern as to the way in which most US jurisdictions currently utilise a 'whole-brain' criterion for death, Davis also speaks to a much broader philosophical point about how we should understand death -- that there are and should be many different definitions of death and the one that we should be interested in at any given time should be contextually determined. By then constraining this to the medical context, Davis' argument is that we need to consider when we still have a duty of care towards a patient. By defining only those things capable of having experiences as possible patients, any permanent loss of higher brain functions would result in a loss of this status too. This opens up a new and interesting line of thought: do we have any duties that extend beyond this that are relevant to being a patient? Davis thinks not but, alas, ends the chapter without pursuing this point further. In many ways, this is the archetypical chapter for this collection -- it provides an elegant and concise debate of a core area and then presents a route to further discussion while (somewhat frustratingly) leaving that new avenue underdeveloped.

Part II concerns who should make end of life decisions. This contrasts to Part I by having a more applied feel to it, with chapters devoted to topics that are familiar territory in bioethics. Although decisions about whether a patient's life is worth living have now moved on from a default best-interests decision made by medical professionals to a move to respecting patient autonomy in such matters, this will not necessarily help us in cases where that individual is not autonomous, such as when they have lost competence. Much discussion over recent years has therefore focused on whether previously formed wishes of an autonomous individual should be taken as determinative in these cases, such as through the use of advance directives. Likewise, much of the discussion in this Part also speaks to this fundamental issue.

James Stacey Taylor, well known for his work on autonomy, makes a case that voluntary euthanasia (VE) and physician-assisted suicide (PAS) should be prima facie acceded to by appealing to how we might consider both personal autonomy and competence when it comes to treatment decisions at the end of life. This acts as a sort of foundation for the subsequent chapters in this Part by grounding the importance of these two key concepts. Given that Taylor starts from the basic position that only competent patients should have their treatment decisions respected, it is fortunate that the additional complexities surrounding such a claim (such as what this means for the status of advance directives or proxy decision-makers) form the bulk of discussion in the two subsequent chapters, as they receive only limited discussion here. Moreover, there is no time devoted to establishing that VE or PAS constitute treatments, and are therefore the sorts of thing that require us to respect decisions concerning their implementation. This, however, does serve to illustrate just how demanding discussions surrounding end of life issues can be. Covering all angles in a single chapter is simply not feasible. What we do get are some excellent distinctions concerning our accounts of competence and the relationship this has to autonomy and the moral weight of decisions.

The two following chapters take up narrower concerns within the theme by looking at the use of surrogates and advance directives respectively. Eric Vogelstein presents us with one of the best essays in the entire collection in terms of providing a crystal-clear overview of the complexities that just one issue can generate. Concerns over counterfactual semantics, personal identity, and moral authority are all briefly attended to before the chapter settles down to focus on establishing a criterion for surrogate decision-making. Here, Vogelstein makes the somewhat controversial claim that respect for autonomy requires only that we respect the desires a patient currently has, as grounding decisions and welfare assessments in the prior values of a now incompetent patient involves some controversial theoretical assumptions. Such a view is often eschewed these days so it is refreshing to see an attempt at developing it. Although the conclusion offered is more of a general request for us to consider how we should respect the autonomy of incompetent patients through considering the arguments between relying on their current and prior values, it nevertheless points us in the right direction for future work -- we should not simply assume that prior values or accounts of precedent autonomy are suitably developed for us to unquestioningly rely upon them.

In Part IV, Jennings' 'Solidarity Near the End of Life' is one of the highlights, offering a discussion that is particularly rich and novel in its application to end of life issues. The concept of solidarity has risen to prominence as a means of addressing questions in ethics that require some focus on collective action, mutual support, shared aims, or of 'standing together'. This has made it a particularly useful concept in areas such as justice and public health, where it is groups rather than individuals that are at risk or who share the burdens. Anyone reading this collection will likely have noticed that, up to this point, the focus has predominantly been on individuals, particularly when it comes to the many accounts of end of life decision-making that emphasise individual autonomy. The focus on solidarity offers a new angle: that we should see such decision-making as involving a relational and communicative element so that, as Jennings puts it, we stand together rather than alone before death.

Rather than thinking about what a more traditional use of solidarity might be put to by making, for example, public policy decisions about death and dying, Jennings sees more intimate levels of decision-making and care planning as being relevant to its application. Making context-sensitive judgements about provisions and goals, sharing values, and providing mutuality and moral recognition, all allow people to attain their desired goals of flourishing (the 'good death') in a way that would be impossible to attain if acting alone. Of course, Jennings' account is brief and just gesturing towards a position. His account of solidarity itself reminds us that the concept is still, in many ways, in its infancy, never mind its application to end of life issues. Nevertheless, it perfectly sums up what this collection as a whole is striving towards -- an excellent account of a major area of concern that pushes us towards ways we might seek to tackle it in the future.

End of life ethics has been stuck in something of a philosophical rut for some time, often involving endless re-hashing of the euthanasia debate or subsumed under more general topics such as the nature of autonomy. This is a shame given that it provides us with some particularly powerful ethical dilemmas, both as individuals and as society, concerning how we confront the universal human experiences of death and dying. While this collection deals directly with many of the central concerns, it also indicates that there is a move to find greater philosophical purchase and depth that the end of life setting is desperately crying out for. In this regard, it can only help to reinvigorate the importance of this topic as an area of rich ethical debate.