Ethics, Exegesis and Philosophy: Interpretation after Levinas

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Cohen, Richard A., Ethics, Exegesis and Philosophy: Interpretation after Levinas, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 370pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521801583.

Reviewed by Robert Gibbs, University of Toronto


Joshua ben Perahyah said: ‘Provide yourself with a teacher; acquire for yourself a companion; judge each person inclined toward merit.’ (Sayings of the Fathers, Chap. I, 6)

Richard Cohen is a great student of Emmanuel Levinas. This quality is displayed in many of Cohen’s writings, but nowhere more clearly and cogently than in this current book. Cohen is not a simple thinker, nor a docile student. His writings are complex and at the same time forthright, even moral. He argues that Levinas’ thought responds to a basic and important suspicion of morality. Cohen writes both in a technical philosophical idiom, and more significantly, in a general and accessible voice about things that matter. That voice and indeed, Cohen’s loyalty to Levinas, raise important questions about the task and style of philosophical thinking. Often there is a presumption that a philosopher must stand free of relations to teachers and to authorities—that thought is self-governed and independent. Others are willing to invest authority in great thinkers (Plato, or Thomas Aquinas, or Kant, or in our time in Heidegger or Freud, Derrida, etc.) but are unwilling to recognize Levinas as an authority. Whom shall I make my teacher?

At the heart of this book, and of this review, is the meaning of exegesis—the process of offering an interpretation of texts. Cohen offers us insight on several levels into the significance of exegesis—and I will briefly outline the main tasks in his book, but I urge you to reflect further with me, on how those tasks are self-reflexive: that is, they are not only described but also performed. The central insight is that Levinas provides a way to make ethics first philosophy in order to show the intellectual elite “that morality is a matter for adults, intelligent adults included.” (1)

The first part of the book (“Exceeding Phenomenology”) locates Levinas in a context of 20th-century Continental philosophy. Cohen makes a strong claim for the importance of Bergson as the turning point to a postmodern harmony of revelation and reason. He tells the story of phenomenology, from Husserl to the students (Merleau-Ponty, Heidegger, Sartre, Levinas, Schutz, and others) in a counter-point with Bergson. He examines the relation between Heidegger and Levinas and maintains a constant critical distance from Derrida, who becomes the leading French student of Heidegger. These relations are explored with careful technical treatments of important themes in phenomenology. But there is a second level of interpretation here: for Cohen frames the agenda in a much more general idiom. The central questions are the relation of reason and revelation and the status of science and its reason. Bergson, even more than Husserl, represents a critical view of modern science, but one that also preserves the achievements of modern rationality.

But against this backdrop, of a crisis of science and a new rapprochement with revelation, there is a much more serious conflict that defines Levinas’ context for Cohen; a division and antagonism between an elevation of aesthetics to first philosophy and an elevation of ethics. This oppositional polarity provides a scale for the contemporary Continental philosophical scene (including the North American outposts). For many who are further toward the aesthetic pole (which seems in Cohen to often be a military camp), ethics seems trivial, secondary, even a matter for the not-so-smart scholars. Levinas and his students, then represent one of the few alternatives. While the ethics crowd (represented almost exclusively by Levinas) stands for the priority of the other person and of responsibility, for Cohen the aesthetics crowd consists of followers of Nietzsche, and particularly of Heidegger. They understand themselves as beyond good and evil and as exploring the appearing and concealing of what is. The primacy of ontology is purchased at the expense of a concern for serious ethics.

The heuristic value of Cohen’s further polarizing of what is indeed a polar tendency in Continental thought is clear and strong. It forces us to ask which questions are the most important, which intellectual tasks are most pressing. It has a tendency to force specific thinkers into one camp or the other (Derrida is repeatedly driven toward Heidegger and away from Levinas, for instance). It raises, moreover, other questions. First, is the Kantian tradition of ethical reflection (say represented most recently by Rawls or by Korsgaard) simply irrelevant to this polarizing schema? That is, if we include what people who are not Continental philosophers are thinking about, does this opposition still hold? This drives us back to the critique of modern reason that both sides of this continental polarity share—that the models of formalist ethics and autonomy are somehow inadequate for raising the most important questions. But we might then ask again, this time about the Frankfurt School. Of course, Cohen might push Adorno, along with Benjamin to the aesthetic side of the scale—but with some difficulty, and then return with Habermas and his followers on the ethical side? Surely the Frankfurters share a profound critique of modern reason, but they do divide up so easily?

Cohen, however, is legitimately addressing the intellectual context in which Levinas studied and wrote. Aside from one essay on Ernst Bloch, Levinas has almost no direct engagement with the Frankfurt School. Levinas studied and wrote about Kant’s ethics, but had almost no word even about Hermann Cohen much less later neo-Kantian ethics. This limitation of Levinas’ claim about ethics as first philosophy is often encountered when Levinas scholars talk with others in philosophy—because it depends on a specific genealogy of thought. There is, simply put, no way to Levinas except through Husserl and especially Heidegger.

When we turn then to the second part (“Good and evil”), Cohen offers important readings of Levinas’ thought more in its own terms. Although here is also a long engagement with Paul Ricouer, with Charles Blondel (another of Levinas’ teachers), and with Derrida again. The primacy of ethics is here defended in terms of the key themes of Levinas: the election for responsibility, the passivity of this assignment, the suffering for-the-other as the base of consciousness itself. In addition, the key chapter of this part (Chapter 7: Humanism and the Rights of Exegesis), explores the way that Jewish traditional texts can provide resources for philosophical thought. This chapter provides a simply magnificent treatment of the way that Levinas appropriates Jewish traditions of exegesis for the sake of a truly humanistic ethics. My own interpretations of Levinas confirm Cohen’s claim that the ‘source’ of Levinas’ way of thinking ethics is a response and continuation of the interpretative tradition of the rabbinic Sages of the Talmud. Ethics becomes here an exegetical task, and exegesis becomes intrinsically ethics. Cohen shows how this way of thinking is in marked opposition and contrast with first Spinoza and then with Nietzsche (and his followers). As impressive and important as the treatment of complex matters in phenomenology was, this relation to a thinking that is in no sense dogmatic or parochial offers great insight not only into Levinas’ thought but also into the task of ethics.

This second part also includes an important discussion of the ‘uselessness’ of the Holocaust. Drawing on two important essays by Levinas (“Useless Suffering”, and “To Love the Torah More than God”), Cohen assembles a clear and forceful argument about why ethics must be pursued in response to an evil that admits of no ‘good’ interpretation. Levinas insists that theodicy is impossible in relation to these evils; that such suffering is truly useless, and that only my own suffering undergone for another is capable of meaning. Given Levinas’ relentless, even infinite, view of ethical responsibility, the ‘problem of evil’ seems to be a huge hurdle—until one notices that the refusal to justify another’s suffering is the fulcrum upon which Levinas’ ethics moves. Cohen offers this reading in a particularly clear and trenchant way.

The salient quality of Cohen’s interpretations, however, is his loyalty and discipline following Levinas. That is, Cohen argues and explicates the philosophical claims of Levinas, claims about ethics, about thinking, about exegesis, and so forth. The project has a further twist—for there is a clear translation, a trans-Atlantic adaptation of Levinas. Levinas had developed a rich and demanding style that suited (and disrupted) the French intellectual scene of the 60’s and 70’s. Cohen writes in a voice that is frankly American—and so it often shocks us with its directness and its unwillingness to make things subtle, or even over-subtle. Some of the essays are rich in complex technical philosophical writing, but the point, again and again, is about the importance of being good, and not just thinking about being. This moral style is self-conscious and is obvious. And it dares us to ask ourselves why this more blunt and moral tone is almost embarrassing for philosophers?

And then we can turn to the issues I raised at the beginning of this review: 1) should a philosopher serve the work of another thinker? and 2) is Levinas a suitable authority? To interpret another thinker, to be a loyal student, is to recognize the authority of the other, of my teacher. Perhaps one of Levinas’ greatest insights is that another person can teach me not only new things, but also a new way of responding. Learning not only content but also to question myself and to respond for the other, even to suffer for the other, my teacher. The self-confidence of a philosopher, to not have any teacher, is a betrayal of the ethics of thinking, a betrayal of the others whom I encounter, and that includes those whom I read and study. Thus Cohen not only reports this lesson about exegesis and responsibility; he also performs it in his adherence to Levinas and more importantly to Levinas’ thought.

As great as this ethical claim upon thinking is, it occurs in a long practiced (if unrecognized) structure of authority in philosophy. Most contemporary Continental philosophers adhere to some figures and strive to give as a rich and sympathetic reading of their works as possible. For Cohen, Derrida, for example, is a disciple of Heidegger, and always tries to save Heidegger’s thought, to think it further and to make it address us again. Cohen, like Levinas, does not conclude that exegesis is simply repetition or uncritical defence. On the contrary, precisely on the issues that concern us most, we are required to criticize, to explore what lies undeveloped, to think with and at times even against the text we study (see 232). Yet Cohen, as capable as he is of strong and blunt criticism of some (Heidegger, Derrida, Nietzsche), is completely won over by Levinas. And there is a great benefit in reading a book so whole-heartedly devoted.

Some would object, in relation to the second question, that Heidegger, or Derrida, or Plato, or… are more worthy of such intellectual loyalty. But Cohen mounts a series of arguments, arguments about what makes a life good, about what is the highest aspect of our humanity, about the primacy of ethics that shows a strong justification of Levinas’ viewpoint. If one makes Levinas’ one’s teacher, then one should learn the primacy of ethics and the value of Biblical humanism. And one has, as Cohen fulfills, obligations to justify the aspects of Levinas that seem limited or faulty.

Two questions, however, remain: 1) whether such a moral and loyal reading is the best reading of Levinas, and 2) whether the moral questions are the most important for philosophical reflection? My own reservations with Cohen’s work lies less in his relation to Levinas than in his relations to others. His choice of polarizing the range of current questions, while more clear than my own efforts and those of most Levinas scholars, also reduces the complexity of Levinas’ own response to those thinkers with whom he disagrees. To hear the moral dimension of others’ questioning, even when they themselves were less than righteous and less interested in that very dimension, is still to learn ethics from many others. Cohen shows proper scholarly respect for the Levinas secondary literature, citing and negotiating with much of it in the footnotes. But he is also quite sure that some questions, some positions, some viewpoints are wrong. Levinas himself wrote with great rhetorical force, attacking many positions, but also listening to the ethical searching in the thinking. One has only to see his reading of Descartes to see this rehabilitation of a truly ethical aspect in a thinker who has so often been identified as the origin of what is wrong in modernity. The moral tone of Cohen’s work is content to label some ways of thinking as bad, even evil. Is this the best translation of Levinas’ own moral authority into an American idiom?

We learn here, then, one way to be a student of Levinas—and the book serves as a great introduction to Levinas, quite possibly the best we now have. If it judges and criticizes others bluntly, then it may be that its force is that of moral thinking, but it may also be a tactical gesture and as such one that we must suspect and engage with great care. For the proper companions are the others with whom I do not agree, who are still other. To acquire a companion requires patience, even passivity, and a listening to learn even from those who refuse to recognize the primacy of ethics. Cohen teaches us one way to become a student, by offering a bold presentation of the priority of ethics.