Ethics for a Broken World: Imagining Philosophy After Catastrophe

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Tim Mulgan, Ethics for a Broken World: Imagining Philosophy After Catastrophe, Acumen Press, 2011, 228pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773539457.

Reviewed by Stephen Nathanson, Northeastern University


Tim Mulgan's Ethics for a Broken World is an extraordinary book. While it contains many standard features of philosophical works -- descriptions of various philosophical views (clearly written and suitable for students and interested non-professionals) as well as analyses and arguments that are in various ways original, it differs from most philosophical works in that virtually none of it is written in Mulgan's own voice. Nor is it written from the perspective of his (and our) own time. Except for a three page preface by the author, the book consists entirely of a fictional transcript of lectures by an imaginary professor who is teaching a course in ethics and political philosophy at some point in the future, perhaps fifty or a hundred years from now.

Unhappily, the world of this fictional philosopher and his students is a "broken world." As a result of the catastrophic environmental changes caused by global climate change, these imagined future people find themselves living in world in which the earth's capacity to sustain human life -- as well as the lives of other animals and plants -- has been severely damaged.

Mulgan's fictional professor's course deals with the philosophies of the "affluent age," the period in which we live and whose inhabitants failed to prevent the catastrophic environmental changes that created the broken world of the future. It is from the perspective of this broken world that the professor discusses the philosophers of affluence.

Much of the power and extraordinary nature of Mulgan's book arises from the shift in perspective that his fictional device creates. Rather than seeing problems and theories discussed from our current point of view, we see them from the perspective of people whose world has been severely damaged by practices that we, the inhabitants of the affluent world, continued to engage in even after evidence of climate change and its future impact emerged. While many philosophers have sought insights by attempting to adopt a "view from nowhere," Mulgan shows us the power of adopting the view from a specific somewhere that differs from our own world and yet is linked to it by a causal history.

By writing in the voice of a person in the broken world, Mulgan is free to be more openly expressive than the norms of academic philosophical writing generally permit. Looking back, the philosopher of the broken world tells his students, "It is too easy to dismiss the affluent people as . . . inhuman abominations who gleefully sacrificed our planet and its inhabitants on the altar of its own greedy indulgence." (12) Though the fictional professor rejects this damning verdict as too strong, Mulgan reveals his own sympathy with it. Noting in his preface that the people portrayed in his book are angry at us and unsympathetic in their judgments about us, he asks, "if you broke somebody's world, how much sympathy would you expect?" (xii)

The shift in voice also allows Mulgan to indulge in occasional humorous -- though often grim -- comments about our current world. When the fictional philosopher discusses an example from Robert Nozick concerning a threat made with a gun, the transcript of the lecture contains a "historical note" which explains that a gun was a "popular private weapon" and that "Astonishingly, the possession of private weapons was tolerated -- and sometimes celebrated in affluent democracy. Some people even claimed a right to carry them!" (25)

Although I have described some key distinguishing features of Mulgan's book, I have not yet said what it is about. The answer is not straightforward. You might expect that the main focus of the book is a discussion of issues concerning climate change and our relations to future people. But, as Mulgan notes in his preface, "this book is not primarily about climate change." (ix) And, while he says that he wants readers to "think about their relations to future people," there is little direct discussion of how we ought to regard these people and what our obligations to them might be. Nonetheless, the setting of the book gives readers a vivid sense of the dire effects of severe climate change and of the reality of the people who will inhabit the broken world that (if it comes about) we will have helped to create. In spite of the lack of much direct discussion of the ethics of climate change and of duties to future people, the book's primary impact may have to do with both of these subjects. By writing about the possible negative effects of our way of life from the perspective of the possible future people who suffer from them, Mulgan effectively evokes both a level of care about them and a sense of regret about the future we may be creating for them.

The book's explicit subject matter -- i.e., the content of the fictional professor's lectures -- consists of various theories and issues in ethics and political philosophy. The lectures include interesting descriptions and insightful analyses of Robert Nozick's libertarian defense of strong individual rights, J. S. Mill's defense of individual rights and freedom of speech in On Liberty, John Rawls' theory of justice, and utilitarian moral theory. The lectures also focus on Hobbes, Locke, and Parfit. In most cases, the views are described, analyzed, and then applied to the circumstances of the broken world. Finally, the professor discusses and severely criticizes both nationalism and democracy.

Apart from Mulgan's interest in specific moral and political issues, he tells us in the preface that one of his main aims is to "highlight the contingency of our moral and political ideals." (ix) In doing this, he takes aim at the tendency of many philosophers to see themselves as defending political and moral ideals that apply to any context. The affluent philosophers who are criticized in the book tended to be optimists who assumed that they were writing about life in "favorable conditions: a situation of such abundance that all basic needs could be met without any compromise to basic liberties." (2) This optimism shaped their philosophies. They did not see themselves as writing for a broken world in which "breathable air, drinkable water, arable land and fuel of all kinds are scarce resources" and weather conditions are so unpredictable that people cannot count on producing adequate food supplies. (8)

In stressing the contingency of moral and political ideals, Mulgan is not echoing the standard relativist view that morality depends on and varies with people's beliefs and attitudes. Rather, Mulgan stresses the connection between moral and political principles and the circumstances in which people live. (Both John Stuart Mill and John Dewey would have applauded this.) The moral and political views of people in the broken world differ greatly from our own. Since they do not live in "favorable conditions," the people of the broken world need a philosophy that is adequate to very different conditions. Mulgan's fictional professor thinks that the philosophies of Nozick and Rawls are inadequate. Utilitarianism comes off a bit better but is also subject to criticism.

Living as they do in unfavorable conditions, these future people have adopted a system that virtually all liberal, affluent thinkers would have condemned. Because the people of the broken world have had to cope with a lack adequate resources to sustain their population, they have adopted the institution of a "survival lottery." Explaining this process, Mulgan's professor cites the experience of Inuit Eskimos. Because they never knew if they would have enough food to survive, "At the start of each winter, the community had to decide who would remain alive until next summer." (9) Similarly, the people of the broken world use a "survival lottery" to administer a system of adjusting the size of their population to the level of resources available to meet people's needs. This requires a system by which certain people are designated to die.

In a late chapter of the book ("Lecture 15"), three students in the course try to adapt John Rawls' theory of justice to the realities of their broken world. They revise Rawls' original position to show how to achieve reflective equilibrium between the original position and their "considered judgment" that the survival lottery is reasonable and moral. They consider various types of survival lotteries that might be chosen by broken world inhabitants behind a modified veil of ignorance. For example, people might consider a ticket that allows for choosing between a longer life with fewer resources or a shorter life with more personal abundance.

In "Lectures 16-17," Mulgan's fictional professor raises serious concerns about democratic forms of government. While the democratic ideals of the affluent age emphasized the importance of considering the needs of all their citizens, they lacked a system that effectively counted the interests of future people. Given that the broken world of Mulgan's book was brought about in part by the inaction of democratically governed societies, it is hard not to see such systems as seriously defective. At a certain point in history, people became aware of the reality of global climate change, came to know the dire effects that they were leaving as their legacy for future people, and still failed to take serious steps to prevent the broken world from coming into being. How good is democracy, we might ask, if it could not prevent this catastrophe?

The philosophies of the affluent age supported a variety of moral and political ideals that stood in the way of preventing the climatic disaster. A key ideal that made preventive actions difficult is the liberal individualist ideal of freedom. A commitment to individual freedom provided the intellectual support for a market capitalist economy in which individuals had discretionary rights to produce, sell, purchase, and use all sorts of goods and services without worrying about the effects of these activities on others.

Given the role of these individualist values, it is not surprising that Mulgan's professor spends a great deal of time (about 50 pages) discussing Robert Nozick's strong defense of individual rights in Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Anyone who wants to defend state action to prevent climate change and a future broken world would have to reject Nozick's individualist perspective and the deontological, anti-consequentialist principles that Nozick uses to criticize constraints on private ownership rights and to support his view of engaging in market transactions as (nearly) absolute, inalienable rights. Mulgan spends more time and energy on Nozick's views than on any other view (though Rawls's views and utilitarianism also receive serious consideration). This is not surprising since if Nozick's libertarian view is correct, the controls on production and use of resources that are needed to prevent destructive climate change ought not be adopted because they violate individual rights of ownership and transfer. The discussion of Nozick's views includes many interesting, powerful arguments against libertarian capitalism and the minimal state.

Mulgan also raises interesting questions about whether Nozick's philosophy actually supports libertarian individualism. He notes that Nozick's principles appear to allow any social system or condition that people voluntarily agree to, even if they strongly constrain individual liberty. He also discusses Nozick's "Lockean proviso" and Locke's own view that just acquisitions require "leaving enough for others." Both versions of the proviso suggest that acquisitions of property fail to be just if they result in insufficient resources for future people. The same questions apply to Nozick's famous Wilt Chamberlain argument. Is a system of voluntary transfers just if it results in a broken world with insufficient resources for its inhabitants?

Lecture 9 addresses the fictional philosopher's concerns about other philosophies that emphasize individual liberty. Here he focuses on Mill's defense of individual freedom of action and of speech in On Liberty. The professor is puzzled that "even after evidence that affluent behavior was causing dangerous climate change became incontrovertible, affluent society still allowed individuals to . . . disseminate dangerous falsehoods (the work of the notorious 'climate change sceptics')." (7) He notes Mill's optimism about the effects of freedom of speech. "Mill assumed that if people enjoy freedom of expression, they will tend to progress towards true and useful opinions." (121) With respect to the free speech of the climate change skeptics, this optimistic view proved to be a catastrophic error. Nonetheless, as the professor acknowledges, had there been censorship rather than free speech, this might have allowed climate skeptics to "silence evidence of climate change." (121)

Of the theories that Mulgan's professor discusses, utilitarianism seems to have the greatest potential for adaptability to broken world conditions. Unlike individualist rights theories, it has a built-in commitment to impartiality, to maximizing overall well-being, and to considering the impact of individual actions on others. Moreover, act utilitarianism is a radical doctrine that rejects the implicit conservatism of philosophical theories that attempt to align themselves with common sense moral intuitions. Overall, act utilitarianism seems capable of adapting to new circumstances and making radical breaks with customary morality when conditions change.

What about rule utilitarianism? In Lecture 11, three students discuss utilitarianism and disagree on how to interpret rule utilitarianism. Some rule utilitarians have sought to avoid the radicalism of act utilitarianism by showing how rule utilitarianism supports common sense morality. The student defending rule utilitarianism rejects this conservative interpretation of rule utilitarianism. If moral rules are justified by the consequences of everyone internalizing a particular set of rules and if conditions change radically -- going, for example, from an affluent to a broken world, then the moral rules that will be appropriate will change because there will be a change in which rules yield the best results. A new moral code will be needed for dealing with new conditions.

Neither Mulgan nor his fictional professor draws any conclusions on these questions, and other problems for utilitarians are discussed. For all its apparent promise, utilitarianism is not specifically endorsed, and other problems with it are considered. Nonetheless, utilitarianism looks more promising from the broken world perspective than its deontological alternatives.

In closing, it is worth keeping in mind the double nature of this very stimulating book. First, there is the novel framing of the discussion and the various intellectual and emotional payoffs that arise from it. As a reader, I was left with a much more vivid sense of the need both to confront climate change as a problem and to think more seriously about the lives of the future people who will follow us. Second, from a more strictly theoretical perspective, Mulgan has succeeded in presenting consistently interesting, informative, and challenging discussions of an array of important philosophical theories, arguments, and problems.

Finally, Mulgan's bold stylistic experiment challenges philosophers who want to contribute to public dialogue about important moral and political issues. Can we learn to write in ways that effectively express relevant emotions without diminishing the logical quality of our arguments and analyses? Can we make philosophical writing more accessible to general readers? Or are we content to write for one another while hoping that other people will try to save the world?