Ethics in Technology: A Philosophical Study

Placeholder book cover

Topi Heikkerö, Ethics in Technology: A Philosophical Study, Lexington Books, 2012, 246pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739168646.

Reviewed by Robert C. Scharff, University of New Hampshire


Most of today's technologies depend on modern science, but technology is not essentially applied science. The use of technologies obviously predates modern science. Moreover, both before and after the rise of modern science, many technologies developed independently or with no particular concern for science. Frequently, pre-existing technologies have actually made a science possible. So, although technological applications of scientific knowledge are now ubiquitous, the relation between technology and science is complicated, multistable, often (but not always) a matter of interdependence and, in any case, ill-served by the knowledge-first, application-second paradigm.

At least this is what today's philosophers of technology tell each other. As Topi Heikkerö knows, matters are quite different in the larger world, where popular conceptions of technology are still mostly derived from Enlightenment ideas about science and tend to retain the applied-science model. According to Descartes' famous metaphor, the tree of knowledge has three main parts: it is rooted in metaphysics, its trunk is knowledge of the Book of Nature, and its three main branches are medicine, morals, and mechanics. Descartes' own interpretations of metaphysics, physics, and their requisite methods of inquiry were all contested from the start, but there has always been less criticism of his implied conclusion. For here is the first full and systematic elaboration of Bacon's slogan that knowledge is power. The Meditations tells us that what is knowable are figure, number, and nature. The Discourse tells us that we can know these things if we put aside faith, politics, axiology, common sense, and everything else historical or cultural. And the metaphorical tree in the Principles prefigures the happy conclusion that science's main benefits will come as fruit from its branches. The world depicted by Descartes' tree has now arrived, though with updated interpretations of its parts. But what has not changed is the implied practical payoff, and the accompanying branch-like and supplementary conceptions of technology and ethics. First, science tells us what there is. Then engineering tells us what we can do with what there is, and finally ethics tells us whether what we can do is permissible. Somewhere in between science and action, mediating our relations with nature, is technology -- the neutral means to do the permissible.

Heikkerö starts here. For him, the fact that most discussions connecting ethics with technology tend to stay inside this Cartesian framework is philosophy of technology's central problem. Above all, it reinforces the practice of taking an applied-ethics approach to whatever moral problems seem associated with technology. So, we have extensive literatures in, e.g., engineering ethics, environmental ethics, and medical ethics, where it is assumed that thinking about these topics under technoscientific conditions is not fundamentally different from thinking about any moral problems under other social and material conditions. We ask about genetic engineering, about pollution, and about who gets a kidney, but we fail to notice that the sheer fact of our immersion in technoscientific life constitutes a challenge to all the familiar ideas about technology and ethical inquiry. In the "developed" world every problem seems in principle to have a technological fix, the mere availability of a technology seems to dictate that it be used, and technoscientific practices happen in networks. In this new world, the old default ontology of individual tool-users making free choices, with each person being held responsible for his or her actions is wholly inadequate. "Technoscientific advance", says Heikkerö, "has altered our 'certainties'" (5). In a technoscientific world, who or what is really autonomous? When the power grid goes down, who is responsible? How many new organs do we get before we are transhuman? In short, the prior philosophical question must be:  what will it take to think effectively about ethics in a world disclosed in pervasively technoscientific terms?

The book's organization reflects Heikkerö's concern for this question. Its "thematic" part (chapters 1-2) identifies some important ways in which technoscientific advance disrupts our received understanding of technology and ethical inquiry. A "descriptive" part (chapters 2-5) presents detailed accounts of three 20th century philosophers (i.e., Hans Jonas, Albert Borgmann, and Larry Hickman) who address these challenges. The concluding part (chapters 6-7) evaluates the strengths and weaknesses of their efforts. It ends by adding Heikkerö's suggestion that more attention be paid to the "meso-level" ethical issues of "policies, institutions, habits, and practices" that lie between the microethical problems of "particular, instantaneous moral choices" and macroethical questions about "general moral principles" (205). Along the way, there are supporting players and an impressive array of asides and endnotes regarding issues not emphasized by Heikkerö. In fact, extensive citation is one of the strengths of the book.

Heikkerö's intentions are not primarily polemical, but continental philosophers will feel more comfortable with his approach. His treatment of ethics in the analytic tradition is thin and cursory and relies mostly on textbook sources. Moreover, the book is infused with an "interdisciplinary" spirit not much respected in Anglophone circles (39-41, 202). Analytic philosophers, he notes, have so far shown little interest in technology, except as a source of issues in applied ethics. For Heikkerö, however, applied ethics is only one of three relevant "research programs," and the other two -- science, technology, and society studies (STS) and what Carl Mitcham calls the "humanities tradition" of the philosophy of technology -- are more important if one wishes to consider the challenges that technoscientific advance poses to our received ideas about technology and ethical inquiry.

Heikkerö therefore looks to STS for an up-to-date picture of actual technoscientific life, both in its global reach and in the details of its actual practices. We need a stiff dose of empirical research, he says, to remind us that we are dealing with a social, cultural, and material whole whose shape and meaning are poorly grasped if we stick to piecemeal analysis of ethical problems and conceive their solutions in terms of individual human agency. Above all, we must stop maintaining the traditional division of human behavior into practical production, moral action, and the quest for knowledge (Heikkerö's interpretations of praxispoiesis, and theoria), where the first and third categories are typically deemed morally neutral when they clearly are not. It is now just too obvious, for example, that production and consumption are not just economic activities, and that scientific research is as much a moral and political act as it is a quest for truth (29-32).

Yet STS, says Heikkerö, "leans toward" the value-free stance of traditional social science. Hence, in order to critically evaluate technoscientific advance, we must also consult those philosophers who have called for a complete "rethinking of the modern [Enlightenment] project" (176, 203). Like Mitcham, Heikkerö is thinking of figures now sometimes pejoratively called "classical" philosophers of technology,[1] because like Heikkerö himself (as well as Jonas and Borgmann), they take "science" and "technology" to represent actual cultural-historical phenomena worth questioning. Heikkerö knows he is bucking an "empirical" trend in recent work here.[2] Yet he warns: "archiving" thinkers like Heidegger and Ellul because they do not privilege the study of particular technoscientific practices betrays an unreflective streak -- one that may well prevent current thinking from becoming the agent of critical and transformative thought that classical philosophy has often been (206).

Heikkerö's rethinking of the modern project begins from the problem famously framed in Weber's "Science as a Vocation" (179-181), in which the value-neutral science of a value-neutral world is radically distinguished from any search for life's meaning or destiny. In taking this approach, Heikkerö is in effect rejecting two alternatives: that offered by science studies (which blames the Weberian image of science and nature as value-neutral on the positivistic distortion of the actual practice of science through its formal and context-free reconstruction of its alleged method), and that offered by Heidegger (for whom "knowing" in Weber's Cartesian sense constitutes a "derivative" mode of being-in-the-world that is undeserving of its ontological hegemony). Here Heikkerö appears to be influenced by Jonas, whose critique of modernity does indeed start from a Weberian conception of science, which he then attacks for its implicit nihilism. As Heikkerö explains, it is against this background that Jonas develops his unabashedly metaphysical doctrine of the ideal coincidence of "being and good" and a reformulated neo-Aristotelian "ethic of responsibility" (52-73). He admits that Jonas' positive proposals are "problematic" but insists we should "advance the themes he started" (74).

That Heikkerö is serious about organizing his study around anti-positivist themes can be seen everywhere except in his account of Borgmann where he appears to adopt Borgmann's more nuanced conception of modern science. According to that conception, the real problem is that scientifically inspired technologies too readily reflect the implicit values science actually possesses (e.g., instrumentalism, a rule-governed sense of right action, reliance on "apodeictic" discourse, progressivist optimism). It thus gives us "devices" that make our lives safer and materially comfortable, but also shallow and unserious. Heikkerö rightly emphasizes Borgmann's critique of our age's dominant "device paradigm," which promotes a "disburdened" sense that life should be as easy as the latest technologies can make it. He explains how Borgmann's alternative call for the cultivation of "focal practices" -- activities like playing music, running, gardening, and family dining -- at least potentially offer occasions for "gathering and directing" our concerns to deepen and humanize our social and material relations (102-111). He concludes, again I think rightly, that of his three authors, only Borgmann "finds a way out of Weber's problem" (181). This is not because Borgmann focuses on "material culture" instead of on "science, [natural] existence, and ideology," as Heikkerö claims. Rather it is because, instead of thinking of himself as placing something humanly meaningful into science's allegedly disenchanted world, Borgmann adopts a post-positivist and pluralistic conception of science that prevents Weberian imagery from dominating the discussion in the first place.

The analysis of Hickman, albeit unintentionally, demonstrates the importance of Borgmann's move. As Heikkerö explains, Hickman recasts Dewey's pragmatism in a way that integrates productive, moral, and theoretical concerns under an umbrella notion of "inquiry" that is no longer specifically scientific. Indeed, he says Hickman has in effect simply "expanded the notion of science" so that "technology" is a kind of "inquiry" and every inquiry is an instance of the "human conscious effort to control and manipulate the conditions of life" (144, 181). Yet if ethics is simply one kind of technological inquiry and its concepts, just another kind of "tool," then Hickman does not save ethics from the "intellectualist, consequentialist, and naturalist" preferences of scientific inquiry. Rather he naturalizes away all differences between ethics and science so that both are equally "inquiries" which somehow "better" initially problematic situations (158-59). We can praise Hickman's "rich and insightful" technological pragmatism, concludes Heikkerö, but regret that as a philosophical orientation, it "lacks [the] orienting and critical power" for "questioning what is against what ought to be" (167).

Overall, Heikkerö succeeds in identifying an amazing number of issues in an accessible way. His summaries of Jonas, Borgmann, and Hickman are fair and accurate, though his strong separation of expository and evaluative sections occasionally forces unnecessary repetition and makes it harder to determine when the text reflects his own voice. As I suggested in relation to his analyses of Jonas and Borgmann, what Heikkerö understands by science, technology, and ethics sometimes appears too heavily dependent on whomever he happens to be discussing. And it is unfortunate I think, that Heikkerö's treatment of Heidegger is brief and relatively weak (e.g., Jonas and Hickman's criticisms are taken at face value). Also unfortunate is the lost opportunity to shed critical light on how Jonas and Borgmann could both be so deeply influenced by him in such radically different ways.[3] But this may be sheer preference. Heidegger's later discussions of techné are difficult to summarize and perhaps too remote from Heikkerö's major themes. It is harder, I think, to defend Heikkerö's choice of major players. Granted that "in its own era, Jonas' metaphysical thinking was extraordinary" (74), his conceptions of both science and the world to which his "ethics of responsibility" is supposed to respond are seriously dated. Moreover, if "transcending the boundaries of modern philosophical traditions, especially the divide between analytic and continental philosophy" is indeed a major rationale for Heikkerö's choices, it is hard to understand why he would embrace one of the major pillars of mainstream Anglophone philosophy and rule out major coverage of, say, Marcuse or Feenberg, because as critical theorists they are interested in "politics" not "ethics" (7). Feenberg, especially, would seem to be an excellent third choice, given his extensive critical exchanges with Hickman (150-51, 166-64) and his obvious qualification as one of Heikkerö's meso-ethical thinkers.

To conclude on a negative note, however, would be unfair. In fundamental ways, Heikkerö is surely right. We cannot continue to treat science, technology, and ethics traditionally and unreflectively. Nor can we continue to separate technoscience studies into applied ethics, phenomenologies and sociologies of the particular, and Big Question philosophies. Heikkerö makes the case for their integration with an impressive amount of material, in accessible prose, accompanied by sensible criticisms.

[1] Recently, the classical figures have come to be identified as belonging to the first and second "waves" of philosophers of technology. See, e.g., Jan Kyrre Berg Olson, Evan Selinger, and Søren Riis, eds., New Waves in Philosophy of Technology, (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009), viii-xiii. The classification is roughly a reflection of generations, measured retrospectively in terms of a trend toward decreasingly global, extra-empirical, and dystopian accounts of technology, usually including [in the first wave] Ortega y Gassett, Jaspers, Cassirer, Jünger, Dessauer, Berdyaev, and above all, Heidegger, and [second wave] Arendt, Ellul, Mumford, Horkheimer and Adorno, Marcuse, and Jonas.

[2] See, e.g., Hans Achterhuis, American Philosophy of Technology: The Empirical Turn, trans. Robert P. Crease (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001), and Peter Kroes and Anthonie Meijers, eds., The Empirical Turn in the Philosophy of Technology (NY: JAI Press, 2000).

[3] There are also other missed opportunities. For example, there is no discussion of Heidegger's detailed argument against instrumentalist accounts of right action like Hickman's ("The Question Concerning Technology," in Basic Writings, rev. ed. (HarperCollins, 2008), 311-41, esp. 312-14, 318-24). Similarly there is no treatment of Heidegger's case against the subjectivist and voluntarist conceptions of meaningfulness forced upon us by thinkers like Weber (where he argues that, ontologically considered, all those allegedly meaningless natural and artifactual entites "are" already meaningfully disclosed, precisely as (otherwise "meaninglessly") set up as and available for anything whatever).