Ethics: Proved in Geometrical Order

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Benedict de Spinoza, Ethics: Proved in Geometrical Order, Matthew J. Kisner (tr., ed., comm.), Michael Silverthorne (tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2018, xlix + 272pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107655638.

Reviewed by Steve Barbone, San Diego State University


Michael Silverthorne and Matthew J. Kisner's new translation of Spinoza's Ethics aims to squeeze its way onto bookshelves already crowded with several widely available and popular English versions, notably the editions by Edwin Curley (Princeton), Samuel Shirley (Hackett) and George H. Parkinson (Oxford), among others. Its useful glossary and introduction make it seem that its target is the undergraduate (or perhaps graduate) classroom. A chronology and a brief but important note on the text and translation complete the introductory remarks. Its annotations are sparse and mostly refer to some upcoming or past material in the text or to some original source material whenever Spinoza seems to be quoting or paraphrasing someone else's work (e.g., Descartes' Passions of the Soul or Terence's Adelphi). The translation itself is very readable, and the pages are not crowded, so there is ample room for notetaking. The paperback version is of a very sturdy construction.

"Traduttore, traditore": "To translate is to betray" or so goes an old saying. The obvious question, then, needs to be posed: What makes yet another English translation of Ethics any less (or more) than just another betrayal of Spinoza? The current work responds in at least two ways. One response is that it is the sole English translation to be based on the not-quite-yet published critical edition of Spinoza's Ethica now being prepared as part of the series Spinoza Œuvres (Presses universitaires de France). This critical edition, reportedly more similar to the Van Vloten and Land edition than the more often cited Carl Gebhardt version, benefits in its preparation from the timely discovery in 2010 in the Vatican archives of a copy of Ethics supposedly handwritten by Spinoza's correspondent, Ehrenfried Walther von Tschirnhaus. Silverthorne and Kisner's translation therefore can claim to get us closer to the original manuscript, i.e., one less layer of betrayal.

Will readers then expect to find a different philosophy in this new translation? In this reviewer's eyes, the answer is yes, but this newer reading may have more to do with the current translators' choices regarding certain terms than with the source material used for earlier translations. It is the decision how to translate this or that term that betrays maybe not just Spinoza but certain biases of the translators, and this is the second response to how this version could claim not to be just another betrayal. This review notes some of these choices and compares them to other translations; only a little effort is made to evaluate the merits of these decisions since readers must decide this question of merit for themselves. The new critical edition was not yet available when this review was prepared; Latin comparisons are made using the Van Vloten and Land edition already noted for being more similar to the forthcoming edition.

Perhaps most striking to Anglophone readers already familiar with Spinoza's philosophy is the absence in Silverthorne and Kisner's translation of Spinoza's famous three kinds of knowledge. Instead, our translators use the term "cognition" to stand for Spinoza's "cognitio," which is most often rendered as "knowledge" by other English translators. Silverthorne and Kisner's glossary defines "cognition" as "the mental state by which one represents, grasps, conceives, or, most generally, is mentally aware of something" (254). With very, very few exceptions, they consistently render this term as "cognition" (one exception is their putting "arbor cognitionis" as the "tree of knowledge" when Spinoza recounts the Adam and Eve story, 210). This choice may help alleviate a difficulty some newcomers have when encountering Spinoza's otherwise labeled "first kind of knowledge" since many might question how opinion, imagination, hearsay, and the like could possibly count as any kind of knowledge, though it is not difficult to account for these as mental states or cognitions. In general, our translators consistently reserve the term "knowledge" to refer to Spinoza's "scientia."

Of Human Servitude would not likely have made such a catchy title for Somerset Maugham's important novel, On Human Bondage, though the former is a more literal rendering of Spinoza's "De Servitute Humana" than the latter, and the former is how the title of Ethics part 4 is given. This more literal turn of phrase, like the treatment of cognitio/cognition, is another example of the current translators' willingness to overlook how many phrases or terms usually have been translated. Perhaps, then, it should not surprise readers that they will not find any reference to a rational viewpoint "under the species of eternity." Instead, reason enables us to see things "from the vantage of eternity" (82). The translators provide a convincing justification for this rendering (xlix). Similarly, we find the expected last line of Ethics, "All things excellent are as difficult as they are rare," rendered as "But all noble things are as difficult as they are rare" (250) ("Sed omnia præclara tam difficilia quam rara sunt," 273). Again, a newcomer to Spinoza's work might not think anything odd about this finishing statement, but more seasoned readers may imagine that something is not quite right; so goes the force of our habituations, and we may wonder by which version(s) we have been betrayed.

An aspect of this translation worth highlighting is our translators' effort to aid readers to be aware of some terms in Spinoza's vocabulary that often are not differentiated in English. An example explicitly mentioned by the translators is Spinoza's use of "potentia" and "potestas," both usually rendered as "power" in English. In this work, the former becomes "power" and the latter becomes "ability" ("aptus" is generally "capable" or "adapted," xlviii). While the casual reader may not be bothered to wonder how the term "power" is used in earlier translations, for better or worse this point has sometimes been the subject of current commentary. In this current version, readers will not have the opportunity to confuse different senses of "power."

There are other terms in 17th-century Latin that often are translated by different -- or sometimes by the same -- terms into English: mens, anima, and animus. Silverthorne and Kisner are usually consistent in rendering these as "mind," "soul," and "spirit" (or "spiritedness") respectively so there is no confusion about which term is used by Spinoza. (An important exception may be their translation of "animi Pathema" as "a passion of the soul," but this is Spinoza's apparent reference to Descartes' own terminology, which more often is rendered as "soul" in English, 155.) In other available translations, there is usually no confusion between the first two terms, but animus, a notoriously difficult concept to nail down, receives a wide variety of renderings. Shirley's version often translates this term as "spirit," "courage," or "mind," and sometimes Shirley's translation removes any reference to animus at all; Curley's usual choices are "mind" and "tenacity" without any textual clues to alert the reader whether the original term is mens or animus.

Whether one approves of any translator's choices of this or that particular English term for this or that particular Latin term, Silverthorne and Kisner are nonetheless usually consistent throughout in assigning one English word for each respective Latin term. Perhaps someone could make some heavy weather over whether God's idea of the divine essence necessarily exists or necessarily is, but in this version, "there necessarily is such an idea" (45) while in Curley and Shirley, this idea necessarily exists ("necessario est" reads Van Vloten and Land, 75). In a similar way, when we read in the current work that something acts, we can be sure that it refers to Spinoza's "agere," and though the Latin verb "operor" is most often rendered as "act" in English, this translation always notes this term as "operate." These differences may be very small things, but Spinoza did in fact use different terms in different passages, and this has not been so well reflected in earlier translations, and that is, perhaps, a signal of a certain kind of betrayal.

There are, though, some fairly straightforward examples of a translator's bias in rendering a passage into English. Take, for example, a usually invective passage wherein Spinoza describes a man's thoughts about his unfaithful female lover: "he is compelled to associate the image of the beloved with the genitals and emissions of the other man" (122). Shirley's version betrays a little squeamishness for what it does not say: "compelled to associate the image of the object of his love with the sexual parts of his rival" (125). Van Vloten and Land: "quia rei amatæ imaginem pudendis et excrementis alterius jungere cogitur" (147). Another example that betrays a bias is noted by what a translator adds to a passage. In this case, Silverthorne and Kisner have "A desire arising from the [true] cognition of good and bad" (170) wherein the translators note by using square brackets and a footnote that they added "true" to the passage because it seemed to fit given the proof; compare this to Curley's "A Desire which arises from a true knowledge of good and evil", wherein no notice is given to readers about Curley's addition (554). For the record, the Van Vloten and Land edition reads, "Cupiditas, quæ ex cognitione boni et mali" (194). (Shirley does not insert the term "true" in this passage.) One might also compare an essential definition found early in Ethics: there seems to be more than mere translation going on when "God" is defined as "a substance consisting of infinite attributes" (Silverthorne and Kisner, 3; Shirley, 31) or "a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes" (Curley, 409). Spinoza's text reads, "substantiam constantem infinitis attributis" (37).

One trouble with translating Latin to English is that while Latin certainly is a gendered language, its being gendered allows it not to have to rely on many pronouns. Translators may be free, then, to choose English personal pronouns as they will, and this may again betray some bias or another. Indeed, the notes on the translation claim that an effort is made to avoid sexist language, and to this end, Spinoza's "homo" (and though it is not mentioned, "vir") are not rendered as "man" but as "person" or "human being" (xlix). The translators make good on this promise though their pronoun choice is decidedly male. Feminine pronouns are used very rarely, and this is only to refer once to nature (a feminine noun in Latin, 158) or to refer specifically to some woman (e.g., the unfaithful lover noted above, 122). "God" (a masculine noun in Latin) consistently takes the masculine pronoun even when it is coupled with "nature" or "substance" (both feminine nouns in Latin) and so could, on such occasions, grammatically, become "she." Perhaps a solution could have been not to use any pronouns for "God" at all.

A very nice feature of this translation is found in its presentation of the Definitions of the Emotions (143-56). In this listing of the various emotions, Silverthorne and Kisner provide, of course, the English name for each named emotion but also supply Spinoza's Latin term as well. This practice helps to minimize any charge of betrayal since readers can see for themselves what terms are being rendered into English.

In sum, Silverthorne and Kisner's new translation is to be appreciated for the work done to help bring English readers closer to Spinoza's text by using different English terms for Spinoza's Latin ones. This choice betrays their decision to favor text over convention insofar as we lose, literally, key aspects of Spinoza's philosophy (e.g., "the three kinds of knowledge"). On the other hand, readers must decide for themselves whether they prefer being betrayed by translations that provide them with phrases and wordings with which they are already familiar even though these beloved phrases may not be quite so literal renderings, or whether they prefer being betrayed by a more textual rendition that forgoes these well-known wordings. At any rate, it becomes a matter of which betrayal we are willing to live with, and it is Spinoza himself who informs us that every interpretation already betrays something of the one who makes it: "It follows . . . that the ideas that we have of external bodies indicate the constitution of our own body more than the nature of the external bodies" (61).


Baruch Spinoza, The Ethics and Selected Letters, Samuel Shirley (tr.), Seymore Feldman (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1982.

Benedict Spinoza, The Collected Works of Spinoza, Edwin Curley (tr., ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.

Benedict de Spinoza, Opera quotquot reperta sunt, Volume 1, J. Van Vloten and J. P. N. Land (eds.), The Hague: Martin Nijhoff, 1914.