Ethics, Sexual Orientation, and Choices about Children

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Timothy F. Murphy, Ethics, Sexual Orientation, and Choices about Children, MIT Press, 2012, 194pp., $27.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262018050.

Reviewed by John Corvino, Wayne State University


The gay-rights movement in the U.S. has made stunning progress of late, with last year appearing to be a tipping point: after previously losing at the ballot box in over thirty state referenda on marriage, in November same-sex-marriage advocates blocked a "traditional marriage" amendment in Minnesota and won marriage outright in Maine, Maryland, and Washington state. More recently, legislators in Rhode Island, Delaware, and Minnesota have passed same-sex marriage, and those in Illinois, Nevada, and New Mexico have taken steps in that direction. Meanwhile, polls show a majority of Americans in favor of marriage rights for same-sex couples.

If you ask people what accounts for their shift in attitudes, you will frequently hear the claim that gay people are "born that way." This claim often seems to be a virtual article of faith among gays themselves, popularized in book titles and rally slogans and Lady Gaga lyrics. And if gays are indeed born that way, the idea goes, then homosexuality is "not a choice" and thus cannot be subject to moral censure.

My own view is more skeptical (and thus, often viewed by my fellow gays as verging on heretical): while research suggests a significant genetic or epigenetic component in sexual orientation, it does not follow that any given individual is hardwired to have the sexual orientation that he or she does, let alone that such hardwiring would answer any moral questions about homosexual conduct (as opposed to homosexual orientation). What's more, the nature/nurture debate is -- or should be -- distinct from the choice/not-a-choice debate, since some innate traits are mutable and some acquired traits are not. Finally, given the complexity of human sexuality generally, I'm doubtful that science is going to find anything quite so simple as a "gay gene."

Against that background, I approached Timothy F. Murphy's book with some trepidation. "Parents routinely turn to prenatal testing to screen for genetic or chromosomal disorders or to learn about their child's sex," the dust jacket announces. "What if they could use similar prenatal interventions to learn (or change) their child's sexual orientation?" Happily, my fear was unfounded: the book is a careful, nuanced, and thought-provoking treatment of a subject that often invites simplistic analysis, even among trained academics.

Murphy acknowledges that his "What if?" question is currently strictly hypothetical: there is no prenatal test for sexual orientation on the near-horizon. But this hypothetical question raises important ethical and political issues about parental choice, government intervention, and child welfare. Thus, the book should be of interest not only to those concerned about sexual-orientation research, but also anyone interested in whether, and to what extent, parents should be allowed to intervene prenatally to influence their children's traits.

Murphy, a bioethicist at the University of Illinois College of Medicine at Chicago, has long been involved in these disputes, and the book reads somewhat like a scholarly memoir. He begins in Chapter 1 by describing the debate's origins in a 1978 study asking gay men and lesbians whether, if it were possible, they would take a "magic pill" to turn them heterosexual. (Most would not.) Suppose such a pill were actually available, and suppose one could administer it prenatally, so that it would involve no re-orientation or disruption (as it would, presumably, for adult homosexuals): should parents be free to use it for their "gay" fetuses?

The book is an extended argument for an affirmative answer to that question, an argument consisting largely in reviews of previous work, including Murphy's own. Chapter 2 (which is oddly short) discusses how Simon LeVay's 1991 work comparing the brain structures of homosexual and heterosexual men sparked a mainstream discussion of prenatal intervention for sexual orientation. Chapter 3 focuses on the genetic studies of Dean Hamer and his colleagues, which prompted much talk of a "gay gene" -- unfortunately, the book came out too soon to include some of the recent hypotheses about epigenetic influences on sexual orientation. (Epigenetic factors are essentially annotations to the genetic code that affect how genes are expressed.) Chapter 4 -- by far the longest in the book -- is aptly titled "Book Reports, Mostly" and it delivers what it promises: a discussion of various books written throughout the 1990s on sexual-orientation research and its moral and political implications. The chapter reads like a thoughtful annotated bibliography, and although one might wish for a more integrated, not-necessarily-chronological treatment of the research, the historical record that Murphy provides here is valuable. Chapter 5 offers a defense of trait selection by responding to recurrent objections to prenatal interventions, and Chapter 6 deepens that defense. Chapter 7 moves beyond the question of whether parents have the right to use such interventions to whether it is morally defensible for them to do so, and Chapter 8 offers a final overview and conclusion. The book also includes an appendix with a table of arguments for and against prenatal interventions.

Murphy's central thesis is controversial, but he defends it ably, largely by way of critically reviewing various arguments that have been offered against it. One can sum up his general stance as "pro-choice": he believes that, absent strong countervailing arguments, parents should be permitted to use available resources to detect and to influence the characteristics of their children, for both deontological and consequentialist reasons. On the deontological side, he argues for parents' strong prima facie right to make reproductive choices without government interference, and on the consequentialist side, he argues that it undesirable for children to be born with characteristics that their parents would strongly prefer them not to have. As Murphy asks pointedly, "Exactly how is it in the best interest of gay and lesbian children to be born to parents who do not want them, to parents who will treat them abjectly, to parents who would have taken steps to avoid exactly those children except that the law stood in their way?" (112).

Of course, the question of whether the law should restrict these choices differs from the question of whether the parents are right to exercise them. Murphy has less to say on the latter question. He contends that it would be heterosexist or otherwise wrong to exercise a basic (that is, non-inferred) preference for heterosexual children, because "there is nothing about heterosexuality that makes a child inherently better than a non-heterosexual child" (117). But he thinks that there might be morally defensible extrinsic reasons for preferring a heterosexual child. For example, perhaps parents believe that they could relate better to children with the same orientation as themselves. Or perhaps they already have gay children, whom they dearly love, but see value in family diversity (much as parents who already have boys might desire a girl, or vice versa, without devaluing boys or girls). Or perhaps they live in a country where penalties for homosexual conduct are harsh, and want to spare their children undue risks. Beyond that, parents may wish to know their offspring's sexual orientation even if they have no desire to change it: perhaps they simply want to prepare themselves to be more supportive parents for their sexual-minority children.

One reason that Murphy does not consider for preferring heterosexuality to homosexuality in children is that only heterosexual relationships can be biologically procreative. Many people desire to create a child sexually with their life partners and thus view infertility as a loss or disability. Murphy argues that it is wrong for parents to deliberately create children with disabilities, such as deafness, "because it subtracts from children a human trait -- hearing -- that is good in itself and its results" (114). He goes on to contrast this choice with the choice of sexual orientation:

In general, parents should not diminish human capacities in a way that closes off goods that are intrinsically valuable, such as hearing and seeing, even if they want to do so in the name of some other good, such as preserving deaf culture. By contrast, choosing heterosexuality in children -- or homosexuality -- does not violate this standard because the choice deprives no one of the intrinsic benefits of sexuality (such as its immediate pleasure) or its extrinsic benefits (such as identities, relationships, and cultural practices) (114).

But, of course, many see the creation of new life with one's partner as one of the deepest benefits of sexuality. (Beyond that, many parents want children who are likely to provide grandchildren who are their biological descendents.)

I grant that the cases are not perfectly analogous, because gay people as a class are not infertile simpliciter: they are infertile only in combination with their desired (same-sex) partners -- and because infertility is not a disability in the same way deafness is. But Murphy's failure to discuss this concern -- along with his rather quick treatment of parents who choose deafness -- is an unfortunate oversight.

Murphy does argue that parents should respect their children's pursuit of happiness even when the goods and identities they find valuable differ markedly from those of their parents, and he notes that such differences are by no means limited to sexuality: "sons of privilege walk away from expensive educations in favor of bohemian lifestyles, daughters convert to religions their parents abhor, and sons and daughters enter into relationships with people that their parents do not understand or value" (115). He also insists on parity: if it is permissible for parents to use prenatal interventions to choose heterosexual children, then it is permissible for them to use prenatal interventions to choose homosexual ones, given that there is nothing morally or psychologically inferior about homosexuality.

Of course, with "reparative therapy" for teenaged and adult homosexuals increasingly discredited, and with LGBT persons finding greater social acceptance, perhaps the interest in such interventions is waning even as scientific advances make them seem more feasible. Even so, Murphy's book provides a valuable critical review of the debate over the last two decades, as well as food for further thought about parental rights, children's rights, and the proper roles of science and government.