Ethics Vindicated: Kant's Transcendental Legitimation of Moral Discourse

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Ermanno Bencivenga, Ethics Vindicated: Kant's Transcendental Legitimation of Moral Discourse, Oxford University Press, 2007, 193pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195307356.

Reviewed by David Forman, The University of Nevada, Las Vegas


Ermanno Bencivenga opens Ethics Vindicated by raising three questions that challenge the legitimacy of our ethical practices: How are human freedom and responsibility possible? How can we legitimately judge some actions or agents to be better or worse than others? And what kind of authority do specifically moral norms have over us? The aim of Bencivenga's book is to show that Kant provides a "successful" answer to these three questions (pp. 1-3). The interpretative thesis here is not the modest one that Kant provides suggestive insights that point in the direction of a satisfactory answer. The thesis is rather that Kant's position is essentially correct as it stands. In particular, Bencivenga treats Kant's transcendental idealism not as an embarrassment from which the practical philosophy can be isolated, but as absolutely central to a possible defense of ethical practice.

Bencivenga begins with an overview of the interpretation of Kant's transcendental idealism that he outlined in his 1987 book on Kant. The central claim in this overview is that, for Kant, "philosophy can only establish logical possibility: it can prove that the description of something, as far as we can tell, is not incoherent," which means that "no knowledge can issue from it" (p. 9).  On this view, Kant cannot intend to prove any (contentful) necessary propositions; he can prove, at most, that there are possibly necessary propositions. Bencivenga's point seems to be that there are an indefinite number of logical frameworks and there is no way to take a stance outside this set of frameworks to select the "correct" one. Kant never intends to do more than define a framework within which we can avoid various difficulties that are generated within other frameworks (particularly the "transcendental realist" ones).

The claim that Kant's philosophy is contentless is surprising since the first Critique's "principles of the understanding" are established in a "transcendental logic" meant to have at least some sort of content lacking in a mere "general logic." But even more surprising is the fact that this characterization of Kant's philosophy is meant to apply to his practical philosophy as well: "Kant cannot even be attempting to prove the categorical imperative"; all he can attempt to prove is that it is possible that the categorical imperative expresses an authentic practical necessity (p. 9).[1] In keeping with this theme of the modest aims of philosophy, Bencivenga gives an especially strong reading of Kant's famous dictum about limiting reason to make room for faith. This dictum is usually taken to mean that reason's theoretical pretenses with respect to the objective reality of its metaphysical "ideas" (God, the world-whole, and the soul-substance) must be silenced in preparation for a "practical extension of pure reason" that can give these ideas their proper sense and justification.[2] In short, theoretical reason is limited to make room for practical reason. But Bencivenga takes the dictum to be of more general (and radical) significance: philosophy cannot aim at any kind of system, but is rather an "unending task" whose claims are always "open to revision" (p. 12), and reason must therefore ultimately "defer … to the nonrational or nonphilosophical as such" (p. 10). It is in this romantic-sounding Kant that Bencivenga thinks we can quiet our worries about freedom and the authority of moral norms.

Bencivenga starts with the following plausible (though not uncontroversial) conception of freedom: our behavior can be considered free from the causal necessity of nature if and only if it is independently intelligible as being the result of rational deliberation (p. 34). The ambiguity in the term "rational" in this conception of freedom leads to the familiar question whether some or all irrational behavior is merely natural -- that is, whether or not only actions that fully live up to standards of rationality could be considered free. There has been a great deal of debate among commentators regarding Kant's answer to this question. It is therefore at this point that a peculiar feature of Bencivenga's book becomes conspicuous: it makes no reference to any secondary literature on Kant other than a brief discussion of Strawson (p. 82) and a handful of other highly dismissive (even curt) remarks not directed at anyone in particular (e.g., pp. 19, 145n27, 149n41). Bencivenga does not comment on this feature of his book, but one can certainly imagine a reasonable desire to keep the narrative focused on Kant rather than on the details of the secondary literature. Nevertheless, an engagement with the secondary literature would have allowed the reader to gain a more precise understanding of the interpretation offered by showing how it differs from (and hopefully improves upon) other readings. And the reader could use help in this regard since Bencivenga does not put much stock in a methodical presentation of his ideas and writes in a somewhat mannered style that relies heavily on metaphor and, although never dull, favors the profound-sounding turn of phrase over clarity and precision. A discussion of the groundbreaking work Christine Korsgaard has produced over the last twenty years would have been particularly helpful, since Bencivenga's interpretation of Kant's account of freedom mirrors Korsgaard's in certain key respects.

Bencivenga takes Kant's view to be that immoral actions are unfree by virtue of their irrationality. In Bencivenga's terms, immoral actions cannot be interpreted in terms of a "rational pattern" since they do not adhere to standards that could apply equally to all rational agents: the only pattern into which they fit is a natural one. Hence there is no such thing as free evil; all evil arises from nature (e.g., pp. 64, 82, 93). This traditional interpretation of Kant's account of the relationship between freedom and morality clearly makes it difficult to answer the initial question about the possibility of human freedom and responsibility. For this reason, a dominant trend in Kant scholarship over the last five decades or so has been to deny the accuracy of the traditional interpretation (especially with reference to Kant's writings from 1788 on): perhaps the immoral will has just enough rationality to be considered free; or perhaps the freedom that is a necessary condition for responsibility is different in kind from the freedom acquired through virtue and lost through vice. Bencivenga can be excused for not rehearsing these alternatives, but it is disappointing that he virtually takes the traditional interpretation for granted despite the fact that it has been questioned so widely in the past.

Rather than following the trend of finding some wiggle-room for Kant to assert the reality of free, immoral action, Bencivenga stresses once again that Kant always aims only to prove the possible, and hence only to prove that it is possible for us to be free (p. 23). However, he does not mean that Kant claims that it is possibly true that all normal human beings are free and thereby responsible for their actions. That is ruled out by his analysis of freedom as rationality. Instead, he takes Kant to be claiming that it is possible to think of ourselves as free in a way that provides us with a standard of behavior to live up to (p. 55), that articulates our duties (p. 37). One way that Bencivenga makes this point is by saying that we can hold a person responsible for his crime without judging that the crime was a result of free choice by treating the criminal in a way that acknowledges his potential to have acted rationally and thus freely (pp. 71-72). But to say that the criminal could have acted differently, that this possibility was real at the time he acted irrationally, seems to contradict the claim that irrational behavior can only be understood as fitting into a naturalistic and thus deterministic explanation; it seems a lot like saying that the naturalistic, deterministic explanation fails to capture the character of the agent's causality, or even like saying that the criminal was a free cause of his crime (p. 72). Thus, the interpretation confronts an apparent contradiction that threatens the very possibility of human freedom.

At times, Bencivenga seems to be drawn toward Korsgaard's strategy of emphasizing a unique "practical point of view" in which the notion of freedom plays a merely motivating rather than explanatory role (e.g., pp. 76, 80). Korsgaard employs this strategy to help Kant avoid a contradiction in his account of freedom.[3] However, Bencivenga ultimately takes the notion of freedom to have an explanatory rather than merely normative or action-guiding function (pp. 36-37). Consequently, he is led to the view that Kant's position on the freedom of evil is "unintelligible" and "absurd" -- and yet recommended by reason (pp. 72-74). Bencivenga acknowledges several of Kant's numerous explicit statements to the effect that the criminal's action is free and not determined by any natural causes (pp. 73, 76, 167n45, 168n46), but he takes these simply to be an expression of an unavoidable fiction: we "must" represent ourselves and other sinners "as if" we were free (pp. 72). Since the claim that the immoral person is free is "counterfactual" (p. 120), reason cannot approve of the content of that claim; but reason nevertheless approves of and even encourages the activity of making that counterfactual claim since doing so signals a veneration for reason that is absent in the immoral behavior under consideration (pp. 74-75), a veneration that has the salutary effect of promoting future rational behavior (p. 79).

The key to Bencivenga's account is the claim that although the concept of free evil is straightforwardly self-contradictory within a transcendental realist framework, transcendental idealism lets us embrace the absurdity of holding ourselves responsible for evil. Transcendental idealism is able to pull off this trick by erasing any clear-cut line between absurdity and meaningfulness (p. 82). Bencivenga remarks (in a stylistically typical passage) that he is struck by

… how rich and varied the spectrum of (non)sense is -- how gradually humans lose their grasp of what they are talking about, and how desperately, in the absence of any clear criteria of significance, they remain attached to what small, fragmentary particles of meaning are still in their hold … We can even mention a free, irrational choice that happens in no world at all, and we still will be putting words together in a way that is not only grammatically appropriate but also has some level of logical legitimacy; we will still be issuing sentences that cannot just be excluded from the range of meaningful expressions. (pp. 82-84)

Bencivenga does not make it sufficiently clear here what it means to say that the concept of a free, irrational choice has "some level of" -- and therefore presumably not unqualified -- "logical legitimacy." He implies that the concept of free evil is not exceptional in this regard, but despite his talk of the richness and variation of the "spectrum of (non)sense" he gives no additional examples that might help us understand the contours of this gray area of meaningfulness. Perhaps he means that the centrality of free evil to our ordinary ethical discourse shows that such talk must be counted as meaningful (see pp. 77-79). But he does not give us any reason to think that abandoning our talk about free evil might be literally impossible as opposed to just counterintuitive or morally catastrophic.

Transcendental idealism is able to create this gray area because it takes objects to be "constitutionally fuzzy" (p. 99). In the relevant case, there is no determinate referent for the "I" that is supposed to be both free and irrational.

[I] have good reasons for both believing that freedom is rationality and hence my irrationality manifests a lack of freedom and for taking charge of what evil I do.  While I call both the objects thus referred to 'me,' I cannot begin to establish an identity between them … And yet, I do not have to, for such 'objects' to play a legitimate and even a highly significant role within the relevant representations and the fields of discourse and activity in which those representations enter… . The opaqueness of reference within [transcendental idealism] is a common destiny. (p. 100)

When I talk about myself as lacking freedom, I am referring to me qua thing in the natural order. But when I take responsibility for the irrational evil I do, I blame "my intelligible counterpart" (p. 99). This entity is free because it is perfectly rational, and, as such, it is impersonal and fictitious (pp. 46-47, 115). In blaming "it" for "my" spatio-temporally located, immoral, irrational behavior, I enter the gray area of meaningfulness: I am straddling the line between the phenomenal and the noumenal without having the resources necessary to establish an identity between the "objects" on each side of the line. Using Kant's religious language, Bencivenga tells us that the best we can do is to hope for, to have faith (Glaube) in, the identity of these two "objects" and therefore in the possibility of "our" freedom. This faith is the basis for the legitimacy of holding the evil will responsible -- as well as for the legitimacy of moral discourse more generally.

In connection with this claim, Bencivenga emphasizes the fact that Kant counts freedom among the postulates of pure practical reason. According to Kant, the postulates are propositions of a theoretical form that, from a purely theoretical point of view, have a "problematic" (or "merely thinkable") status, but which can be justified with reference to morally practical reason. Bencivenga devotes several pages to a discussion of the postulates, complete with supporting material from Kant's lectures and Nachlass. But he fails to mention the salient fact that, for Kant, freedom has an importantly different justification than the other two postulates. We must assume the existence of God and the immortality of the soul because they are conditions for the possibility of the realization of the object of a human will determined by the moral law, namely "the highest good." Freedom, on the other hand, has a more immediate connection to the moral law: as the causal law of freedom, the moral law "proves not only the possibility, but the reality [of freedom] in beings who cognize this law as binding upon them."[4] On these grounds, Kant claims that the only "matters of faith" are the existence of God and the immortality of the soul. Human freedom, by contrast, is a "fact" (Tatsache) since its "reality … , as a particular kind of causality, … can be established through practical laws of pure reason …"[5] If Kant is mistaken to think that the idea of human freedom is on firmer cognitive ground than the other postulates, then Bencivenga should alert us to this fact.

This is not the only case where Bencivenga's exposition of Kant is misleading or even unreliable.[6] But this particular case has important implications. The demotion of the cognitive status of our concept of freedom weakens the very notion of "faith" at issue. On Kant's view, our faith and hope in God and immortality count as rational (rather than, say, fideistic) on account of the connection of these ideas to the cognitively more secure idea of freedom.[7] If freedom is no longer cognitively secure, then the basis on which rational faith rests is taken away. Hence not even the idea of freedom could be a matter of rational faith: practical reason could not elevate the idea of freedom above the merely "problematic" status already established through the purely theoretical tools of transcendental logic. Bencivenga seems happy to embrace a weakened sense of the "faith" in our freedom, taking it to be a central instance of the Kantian task of defining the logically possible: what Kant aims to show in all of this is only that "no one can deny [freedom's] status as a legitimate object of thought" (p. 114). However, Bencivenga does not take Kant to have shown the concept of ordinary human freedom (free evil) to be coherent in any conventional sense. Bencivenga's analysis actually demotes the concept of human freedom from the problematic status Kant tried to establish in his theoretical philosophy: according to that analysis, we must take the proverbial salto mortale into the realm of the absurd just to hold on to the idea that human freedom is even thinkable.

The fact that human freedom appears absurd within the logical "framework" of transcendental idealism might seem to recommend seeking an alternative framework within which a coherent conception would be possible. That quasi-Hegelian move seems especially appropriate given Bencivenga's view that a "framework" is a purely logical construction without content that cannot have any sort of external validation as the "correct" one. But he rejects this move for what seems like the idiosyncratic reason that he himself values "the thrilling challenge of a life form perpetually out of balance" (pp. 117-118).[8] Regardless of whether one thinks this is a good reason for holding on to an avowedly absurd conception of human freedom, it certainly marks a departure from Kant's own view that since there is only one reason, "there cannot be many philosophies," "there can be only one true system of philosophy."[9]

The answer to the initial question about how human freedom and responsibility are possible leads almost immediately to the answer to the question about the authority of moral norms. We can reconstruct Bencivenga's strategy as follows. We first note that the most serious threat to the authority of moral norms is represented by fatalism, that is, by the claim that human freedom is impossible because causal determinism is true (p. 41). It turns out that this fatalism depends on the logical framework of "transcendental realism," and there is nothing mandatory about inhabiting that (or any other) logical framework. Human freedom remains possible within the alternative framework of "transcendental idealism." Moreover, analyzing the character of freedom reveals something about the general features of moral norms: the free act can be defined as an act occurring according to a rational rather than a natural pattern, and conforming to a rational pattern means doing what reason judges as "unconditionally" or morally good. Once the fatalist threat is disposed of by turning to the framework of transcendental idealism, "the claims of conscience forcefully assert their right to be heard" (p. 29).

This is an ambitious and promising strategy for a "vindication of ethics" that is recognizably Kantian. It is true that the strategy will seem like a nonstarter for those who are sympathetic to a compatibilist conception of free will -- to say nothing of those who think that our ethical practices can do just fine without free will of any variety. But this book is simply not written for them. (On the other hand, Bencivenga's argument that the concept of free evil is "absurd" will probably seem like a reductio to all but the most committed incompatibilists.) What is more central to Bencivenga's project is articulating the relation among freedom, rationality, and morality. And the key to establishing this relation is the claim that in order for us to consider an action as explicable by a rational rather than a merely natural "pattern," we must be able to give it a "categorical explanation." By this, Bencivenga means that the explanation of a (putative) action cannot appeal to the agent's needs, desires, volitions, or anything else outside the agent's rationality itself (pp. 36-37). In support of this claim, Bencivenga appeals to what one might call the "objectivity" of rational standards: accounting for this particular agent's behavior in terms of a rational rather than natural pattern is simultaneously accounting for the behavior of any rational agent who finds himself in the same circumstances (p. 36). That account of "objectivity" can be given either an innocuous or a robust reading. On the innocuous reading, being "in the same circumstances" includes having the same needs, desires, and plans -- having the same "subjective set," as it were. This innocuous reading of objectivity clearly does not imply that rational explanations must be "categorical." Bencivenga's argument relies instead on a more robust understanding of objectivity: the action is explicable in terms of a rational pattern only if it would be rational to do for anyone who finds himself in these purely external circumstances regardless of what his needs, desires, or plans might be. But that is not plausible as a general account of what makes rational requirements in principle applicable to any minimally rational agent -- as Kant himself acknowledges by noting that imperatives (thus also hypothetical imperatives) offer grounds that are "valid for every rational being as such."[10] Bencivenga encourages the robust understanding of objectivity by citing Kant's characterization of reason as satisfied only by "the unconditioned for any given condition" and therefore as satisfied only outside of the world of experience (p. 35). But Bencivenga does not offer independent support for the accuracy of this characterization of reason. Nor does he explain how that characterization implies that any activity that fails to attain such satisfaction thereby fails even to count as an exercise of rationality. As a result, it remains unclear why we should think that the only authentic exercises of reason are "categorical" in nature and thus unclear why non-categorical rationality could not be accounted for in terms of its fit into a rational rather than natural pattern. In addition, readers already skeptical of Kant's association of such "categorical" rationality with moral requirements (e.g., Humean non-cognitivists and Hobbesian contractarians) will not find anything new here to challenge that skepticism.

Even if we accept the view that moral requirements would have to be "categorical" requirements of reason, Hegel's familiar worry about the "empty formalism" of the Kantian system of morality remains. All we are told is that the action's rationality cannot have anything to do with the satisfaction of the agent's needs, desires, and plans. How can any content be derived solely from the merely formal requirement that actions conform to this sort of "categorical" rationality? Bencivenga does not directly address this "empty formalism" charge. Instead, he makes a virtue out of necessity by claiming that Kant's properly philosophical contribution is merely to have created the logical space necessary for substantive discourse about the content of morality (the titular "transcendental legitimation of moral discourse"): insofar as Kant seeks to determine ahead of time what the content of morality is supposed to be, he is proceeding in a dogmatic way that is not consonant with the primary thrust of his moral philosophy.[11] But rather than undercutting the "empty formalism" charge, this claim actually greases the wheels of Hegel's dialectic. For it raises the question: What could constrain moral discourse from becoming (spuriously) infinite chatter? Perhaps in anticipation of this objection, Bencivenga implies that substantive accounts of the content of "categorical" patterns of action originate in the "nonrational or nonphilosophical." On this view, philosophy's job is merely to provide the critical attitude crucial for moving our substantive moral discourse in the direction of the "unattainable ideal" of moral certainty (an ideal that we must treat "as if" possible) (pp. 12, 40). The non-dogmatic but critical attitude for philosophy is appealing, but the account of the progress of moral discourse remains wholly programmatic. In particular, Bencivenga fails to offer any details that might help alleviate Hegel's worry that the recourse to "material from outside" reason makes a critical attitude toward that material impossible and thereby merely highlights the problem with the original "empty formalism" rather than moving in the direction of a solution.[12]

Bencivenga has written a personal and impassioned work that, although frustratingly obscure at times, is certainly never boring. Kant is his "hero" (p. x), and he pays appropriate homage to him by drawing citations from Kant's entire corpus, even going so far as to take frequent advantage of the recent Cambridge translations of significant portions of Kant's lectures and Nachlass. As a result, about half of the 119 pages of his main text -- and even more of the 67 pages of endnotes -- consist of Kant's own words. This does not leave Bencivenga a great deal of space for his own extremely ambitious interpretive and philosophical project. (And this review has touched on only the key parts of his project, neglecting his discussions of moral dilemmas, the role of examples in moral education, the causal overdetermination of free actions, the source of political authority, and so forth.) It is therefore not surprising that his book lacks the kind of exegetical work historians of philosophy expect in support of a controversial interpretive thesis. Indeed, Bencivenga seems positively uninterested in that kind of scholarship and almost impatient to present the picture of human freedom and morality with which he identifies so strongly. Perhaps other readers will also identify with that picture. And even if Bencivenga's picture of human freedom and morality seems unpalatable, it is hard to see how Kant can avoid such a picture if tradition is correct to ascribe to him the view that human freedom is achieved only with virtue. The value in Bencivenga's book is that it shows us what a serious and sustained attempt to hold on to that traditional interpretation looks like.

[1] Unfortunately, the only direct textual evidence Bencivenga offers here in support of the claim that Kant has a concern for the “possibly necessary” is a passage from the logic lectures that clearly refers to the special combination of necessity and contingency present in a hypothetical imperative: if one wills some arbitrary end, then willing the indispensable means to that end becomes practically necessary (p. 127n12).

[2] See Critique of Pure Reason, trans. by P. Guyer and A. Wood (Cambridge University Press, 1997), p. 117 (Bxxx).

[3] See “Morality as Freedom” in her Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge University Press, 1996).

[4] Critique of Practical Reason, trans. by M. Gregor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), p. 42 (Ak. V:47); my emphasis.

[5] Critique of the Power of Judgment, trans. by P. Guyer & E. Mathews (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000), p. 332f. (Ak. V:468-469); my emphasis.

[6] In fleshing out the traditional interpretation according to which evil is unfree, he cites Kant’s distinction from the lectures between the “practical necessitation” of a free being through a “motive” and “pathological necessitation” through a “stimulus” (p. 31). But Bencivenga fails to note that in the same lectures he cites, Kant associates “motive” and “practical necessitation” with all imperatives (thus also non-moral ones) and explicitly distinguishes pathological necessitation from the pragmatic necessitation associated with non-moral goods. At one point, Bencivenga suggests that hypothetical imperatives are equivalent to technical imperatives (p. 57) and later that a hypothetical imperative would rise to the status of an assertoric imperative if the end in view were an end shared by all human beings (p. 87). But assertoric (= pragmatic) and technical (= problematic) imperatives are, for Kant, the two species of hypothetical imperative. When talking about reason’s struggle against natural inclinations, he cites Kant’s definition of rightful coercion as a “hindering of a hindrance to freedom” (p. 89). But that definition arises in the political context of Kant’s Doctrine of Right and concerns external or physical freedom, not freedom of choice; if Bencivenga means to be drawing on the account of external freedom by way of analogy, then he should say so. Bencivenga also has a tendency to assemble quotations of doubtful relevance to the narrative he is presenting. For example, after claiming that a categorical imperative commands what is purely rational without regard to what is particular about each individual, Bencivenga cites two passages from Kant to the effect that (1) if we are to make sense of our moral vocation, we must consider the will to be determined by the moral law and (2) Epicurus differed from the Stoics in placing the motive to virtue in pleasure (pp. 88-89). These quotations (particularly the second) don’t justify or help us understand the preceding claim in any way. And after claiming that I must believe I could have avoided doing evil although I know I could not have, Bencivenga quotes eight lines from Kant to the effect that even though one cannot undo the past, the feeling of repentance is rational since morally practical reason disregards the time a deed occurred and considers only if I am responsible for it or not (p. 73). But of course, to say that I cannot undo the past is trivial and does not imply that, in the past, I lacked the ability to have avoided evil. Indeed, on the most natural reading of the passage, Kant is in fact insisting on this difference.

[7] Kant famously remarks: “Now, the concept of freedom, insofar as its reality is proved by an apodictic law of practical reason, constitutes the keystone of the whole structure of a system of pure reason, even of speculative reason; and all other concepts (those of God and immortality), which as mere ideas remain without support in the latter, now attach themselves to this concept [of freedom] and with it and by means of it get stability and objective reality, that is, their possibility is proved by this: that freedom is real, for this idea reveals itself through the moral law” (Critique of Practical Reason, p. 3 (Ak. V:3-4); first and third emphases added).

[8] In a different context, he dismisses the Hegelian Aufhebung as “a pathetic attempt at having one’s cake and eating it too” (p. 56). But that culinary metaphor seems to apply at least equally well to his own attempt (which, however, I would not call “pathetic”) to say that the ordinary human being is unfree by virtue of his evil and yet somehow free after all.

[9] See Kant, The Metaphysics of Morals, trans. by M. Gregor (Cambridge University Press, 1996), p. 4 (VI:207).

[10] Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, trans. by M. Gregor (Cambridge University Press, 1997), pp. 24-25 (IV:413).

[11] Bencivenga gives the following example of how such (defeasable) moral discourse might proceed: “If we expect a rational agent to be consistent over time, it will follow that it is contradictory (hence ruled out) for her not to fulfill her promises -- and a duty to fulfill them” (pp. 37-38; my emphasis). This derivation of the duty to fulfill promises is shockingly implausible. The derivations (in the same paragraph) of the duties against lying, neglecting one’s talents, suicide, and selling oneself into slavery are similar. It should be emphasized, however, that Bencivenga acknowledges that any such derivations depend not just on the concept of practical consistency, but also on the particular way that the concept of a perfectly rational agent is given a substantive articulation within actual moral discourse.

[12] See, e.g., Hegel’s Elements of the Philosophy of Right, trans. by H. B. Nisbet (Cambridge University Press, 1991), p. 162 (Remark to §135).