Ethics Without Intention

Placeholder book cover

Ezio Di Nucci, Ethics Without Intention, Bloomsbury, 2014, 266pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472532961.

Reviewed by Patrick A. Tully, University of Scranton


The Doctrine of Double Effect (DDE) is generally regarded by those who employ it as a helpful tool in discerning whether an agent may licitly choose to act in a way that promises to bring about both benefit(s) and harm(s). Ezio Di Nucci presents a number of arguments against the plausibility and usefulness of DDE and concludes that DDE "should be abandoned" (Preface). In this review I focus on the core arguments of each chapter as I offer a critical overview of his project.

Di Nucci begins by offering some preliminary points designed to set the stage for his subsequent arguments against DDE. He has the following three cases play a recurring role; I will make repeated reference to them.

Terror Bomber (TB). TB's plan "is to bomb the school in Enemy's territory, thereby killing children of Enemy and terrorizing Enemy's population" (10).

Strategic Bomber (SB). SB's plan is "to bomb Enemy's munitions plant, thereby undermining Enemy's war effort. Strategic Bomber also knows, however, that next to the munitions plant is a school, and that when he bombs the plant he will also destroy the school, killing the children inside" (10).

Bystander at the Switch (Bystander). This is the standard Trolley Problem in which a bystander has the option to divert a runaway trolley and thereby save five people who find themselves on its current track. However, the bystander also sees that if the trolley is diverted, one person on another track will surely be killed.

Chapter 1 offers the reader this overview of what is to follow:

The agent's intentions in bringing about a negative consequence are, according to the Doctrine of Double Effect, relevant to the moral permissibility of bringing about that negative consequence -- this is both the topic of this book and the claim that I dispute throughout, arguing that the Doctrine of Double Effect fails to show that the difference between intended means and merely forseen side effects is relevant to moral permissibility and justification. (4-5)

In Chapter 2 Di Nucci identifies what he finds to be the claim at the heart of DDE: "that the same effect can be permissible if a merely forseen side effect but impermissible if an intended means" (35). He notes that a proponent of DDE may defend the clarity -- and thus the usefulness -- of this distinction by means of the counterfactual test of intention. But, Di Nucci argues, the counterfactual test fails to draw this crucial distinction clearly and so any support that DDE might seem to gain from the counterfactual test disappears.

Here Di Nucci rejects the moral relevance of the fact that in Bystander and SB the side-effect of killing innocents is merely foreseen but that in Fat Man (a bystander pushed on to the track to stop the trolley) and TB this harm is intended. Di Nucci's rejection hinges on his claim that in all four cases,

both means and side effects are such that they only have dependent value: namely they are only valuable insofar as they enable some further means or ends. That is the simple reason why the counterfactual test does not work in distinguishing between means and side effects; because it actually appeals to a feature which means and side effects have in common, namely that they are not valuable in themselves but only in virtue of their supposed relation to the achievement of some further means or ends. (33-34)

Some readers will no doubt find Di Nucci's argument here a bit too quick. Although the agents in Fat Man and TB do not choose to target the innocent as an end in-itself, they (unlike SB and Bystander) do choose to use the innocent in a way that perhaps Kantians and Natural Law proponents would find morally unacceptable. Developing this kind of counter-objection and offering a reply would make this provocative discussion even more helpful.

In Chapter 3 Di Nucci points out that DDE does not simply repeat in condensed form a way of reasoning through tough cases that one finds in Aristotle. He also presents what he calls "the argument from marginally bad means" (61). He writes,

if the Doctrine rules against all bad consequences as long as they are intended no matter what, then the Doctrine is forced to rule against countless cases where intuition tells us that acting is not only morally permissible but also morally obligatory, as in the obvious choice -- for any sensible person -- between a cargo of mobile phones and the lives of crew members. (59)

Di Nucci claims that one can produce

countless counterexamples to the Doctrine of Double Effect by generating cases where the bad means (such as dropping a cargo of mobile phones) is not even remotely morally comparable to the good effect (such as saving the crew). And the problem for the Doctrine is that it would not allow for such case of marginally bad means. (59-60)

Indeed, on pain of implausibility, the moral theory that grounds the principles that together form DDE would have to give a reasonable account of the difference between an instrumental good (like a mobile phone) and an intrinsic good (like a human life). But one who employs DDE from, say, a Natural Law approach would have little trouble with such a hierarchizing of goods and harms and would, therefore, have little trouble offering the kind of solution that Di Nucci seeks for the case at hand.

Chapter 4 presents a detailed and careful examination of the Bystander case and some variations on it. Di Nucci believes that many find DDE to offer a plausible defense of the putatively widespread intuition that diverting the trolley is morally acceptable. He argues, however, that "the Trolley Problem does not actually support the Doctrine of Double Effect because . . . intervening in Bystander at the Switch is, differently from what the Doctrine suggests, not permissible" (65). Here Di Nucci turns to Judith Jarvis Thomson for help, noting her claim that sacrificing oneself in order to stop the trolley and thereby saving the five strangers (were this option available) would be an act of supererogatory altruism. This being so, to divert the trolley in the standard case would be to volunteer that stranger for this non-obligatory sacrifice; doing so would be wrong. So, if DDE supports the putatively widespread intuition that the bystander may divert the trolley, then all the worse for DDE since that option is morally impermissible. One shortcoming of the argument here is that it seems to move from the observation that some may find DDE to be an apt approach to defending the "widely shared moral intuition" (78) that diverting the trolley is acceptable, to the conclusion that DDE is somehow conceptually committed to a defense of this ostensibly impermissible option. It would have been interesting to see Di Nucci's case for this kind of entailment.

In chapter 5 Di Nucci presents some empirical evidence that undermines the claim that the moral acceptability of diverting the trolley is a widespread, settled intuition. Such evidence is relevant because, as mentioned above, DDE is often thought to support that putatively widespread intuition, thereby fortifying DDE's plausibility. The evidence presented here was generated by Di Nucci himself by means of a survey that, following Judith Jarvis Thomson's lead, altered the traditional formulation of the dilemma -- Should I let the trolley continue on the track where it will kill five, or should I divert it to a track where I see it will kill one? -- by adding this third option: Should I divert the trolley to a third track where I am currently stuck? The results are quite interesting. Di Nucci writes,

The difference between the results of [the traditional dilemma] Bystander at the Switch when answered in isolation and Bystander at the Switch after having answered Thomson's trilemma is impressive. In the former case, a significant majority answer that intervening is permissible (confirming previous studies). In the latter case, the intuition that intervening is permissible disappears, with just over a third of respondents sharing it. (98)

And so, as goes the supposed widespread intuition that intervening is permissible, so goes the supposed support that this intuition offers to DDE.

The center of gravity in chapter 6 is what Di Nucci refers to as "the problem of closeness," which is short-hand for the claim that the intending-foreseeing distinction at work in DDE "is so arbitrary that one can argue in all the relevant cases that the harm is not intended but rather merely forseen" (103). This being so, DDE is left unable "to rule against a wide range of intuitive impermissible cases" (103).

Di Nucci turns to a case originally constructed by Philippa Foot to illustrate the problem: one member of a group of cave explorers gets stuck (head down) in the mouth of the cave, blocking his party's exit as flood waters in the cave rise. The only way to escape death for all is for the party to use dynamite and blow their stuck companion out of the mouth of the cave, a move that will surely kill him. Di Nucci believes that if DDE were a sound approach to assessing such cases, it would be able to rule out the intentional harm of blowing up the stuck explorer. But, he believes, it cannot. He turns to Foot to make this case:

suppose that the trapped explorers were to argue that the death of the fat man might be taken as a merely forseen consequence of the act of blowing him up. ("We didn't want to kill him . . . only to blow him into small pieces" or even ". . . only to blast him out of the cave.") I believe that those who use the doctrine of the double effect would rightly reject such a suggestion, although they will, of course, have considerable difficulty in explaining where the line is to be drawn (105-106).

Here Di Nucci finds "a potentially devastating challenge to the intending/foreseeing distinction, according to which the distinction is so arbitrary that it can be also applied to all the cases that the Doctrine of Double Effect would want to forbid" (106). The remainder of the chapter is taken up with Di Nucci's critical presentation of ten different attempts (by ten different contemporary authors) to respond to this challenge. One by one he takes up these responses and argues that each in turn does not succeed. He writes later that "these attempts at dealing with the problem of closeness fail to show that I cannot free us without thereby intending to kill the fat guy. But if I am allowed to do that, then what on earth am I still not allowed to do?" (206). This part of his intricate but fast moving argument may have benefitted from an explanation of why the ten authors chosen constitute the best (or at least a good) set to be considered here. A related disappointment is that the thought of Alexander Pruss, one of the authors listed in the set of ten (103, 107), is never discussed. (This kind of oversight is repeated elsewhere in the book. For example, the Index lists several pages in its entry for Thomas Aquinas, yet Aquinas does not appear on many of those listed pages.)

Chapter 7 focuses on Thomson's "Loop Variant" of the standard trolley problem according to which the trolley can still be diverted away from the five workers and towards the one, but with the added feature that the second track loops back toward the five at a point just past where the one is located. Because of this added feature, diverting the trolley would still lead to the death of the five, if not for the fact that the body of the one will block it. Here Di Nucci finds DDE to be unable to support the supposedly correct judgment that diverting the trolley is permissible in both cases. If in the standard trolley case the diversion is permissible because the harm to the one is merely a side effect of the act that saves the five, then how can DDE support the permissibility of diversion in the Loop Variant where the harm to the one is the means by which the five are saved?

Di Nucci looks to Frances Kamm's distinction between "in order to" means and "because of" means and considers whether it would allow a defender of DDE to argue that diverting the trolley in the Loop Variant would be acceptable if the diversion was chosen 'because of' how it would impact the victim but not 'in order to' harm that victim. He concludes that this distinction does not hold up to scrutiny and thus does not help DDE solve the challenge posed by the Loop Variant. Here, though, a reader might meet with some confusion. The challenge that the Loop Variant is supposed to present to DDE assumes the permissibility of diverting the trolley in this case. But why assume that? In chapter 4 Di Nucci himself calls into doubt this permissibility, citing data which suggest that "respondents are split around 50-50 about the permissibility of diverting the trolley in the Loop Variant" (76).

In chapter 8 Di Nucci returns to the TB and SB cases to lay out his next argument against DDE. He writes, "The philosophical discussion of terror bombing and strategic bombing starts with the intuition that there is a moral difference between them; indeed, the Doctrine of Double Effect is normally offered as an explanation of the moral difference" (161). Since TB intends both to harm civilians and to use this harm as a means to his ultimate end of winning the war, while SB does neither, DDE would support the intuition that SB is morally in the clear while TB is not. Di Nucci, however, argues that the intend/forsee, means/side-effect distinctions do not account for the supposed moral difference between these agents. DDE, then, would mislead those who turn to it for guidance here.

Di Nucci begins his examination of these two cases by stipulating that in each scenario there is a school and a munitions factory standing side by side and that both bombers "know that they cannot destroy munitions without killing children (and that they cannot kill children without destroying munitions)" (164). Given these stipulations, he notes that both pilots engage in identical behavior (dropping bombs that they know will destroy both a munitions factory and a school) for identical reasons (to weaken the enemy) and get identical foreseen results. He then raises the question that he believes exposes the failure of DDE here: "Where does the difference in intention come from?" (164). One might reply that both pilots had a duty "to choose 'destroying munitions' over 'killing children'" (164) and that TB violated this obligation while SB didn't. But, Di Nucci argues, to offer this answer would be to ground the moral difference between the two in that duty and not in the intend/forsee, means/side-effect distinctions. Di Nucci thus finds DDE offering no help in drawing a moral distinction between TB and SB.

Chapter 9 is presented as a supplement to chapter 8, offering empirical data on moral intuitions relevant to the SB and TB cases. The data indicate that while it is easy enough to discern the difference between intending and merely foreseeing the harm to innocents at the heart of these two cases, this difference is not widely believed to be morally relevant. DDE, then, asserts a moral difference where none is to be found. Furthermore, if one were to offer a case in favor of this distinction being morally important despite the failure of so many to grasp it intuitively, the important work would be done by the moral theory or principle in question and not by DDE. In this case, then, Di Nucci believes DDE would be superfluous.

In Chapter 10 Di Nucci suggests that employing DDE would lead one to find a moral difference between embryo loss resulting from in vivo conception and embryo loss resulting from in vitro conception. However, he argues, no such moral difference exists. Thus DDE once again misleads.

Di Nucci's argument here is perhaps the least developed of the book's core arguments and would be improved were he to raise and respond to a few obvious objections. First, his claim that in vivo conception "kills" embryos seems strained and tendentious (193). Second, Di Nucci argues that the destruction of embryos carried out in the course of stem cell research may not be an example of intended embryo death, and so a DDE-driven case that there is a moral difference between that kind of project and in vivo reproduction would fail. Regarding the researcher who disaggregates embryos in order to harvest their stem cells, Di Nucci writes, "should embryos somehow survive her research intact, she will not 'go after them'" (195). Di Nucci's acceptance of this far-fetched reply to the charge that the researcher intends lethal harm to the embryos is rather unexpected given that earlier in the book his reply to the claim that those who bombed cities may not have meant to kill people but only to destroy their homes (while they slept in them) was, "Yeah right!" (175). That aside, Di Nucci's argument here focuses on the death of the embryo as if that were the only harm involved in the kind of in vitro reproduction projects he is examining. Yet the (intended?) harms of disaggregating embryos, cryogenically storing them, and using them as tools in the service of others are common features of these projects not found in in vivo reproduction. These differences may make a moral difference that DDE would help one to discern.

With the SB and TB cases in mind, and preserving the symmetries between them stipulated in chapter 8, Di Nucci explains that, "morality must answer the pilot who wants to know what she may/ought/shall (to) do, should she drop the bombs or should she not drop the bombs -- that is the pilot's moral dilemma" (200). Chapter 11 presents Di Nucci's case that DDE is unhelpful here, too. He finds that DDE would indicate that the pilot may drop the bombs if doing so is carried out with the proper intention. But then TB could simply drop his intention to harm children, replace it with the intention to destroy the munitions plant, and go about his bombing run in precisely the same manner. What difference, then, did DDE make? A defender of DDE might reply that intentions cannot be so easily dropped, but by doing so Di Nucci finds a new problem generated, namely, that DDE would then be making "the moral permissibility of something depend on something else which is not controllable and we would thereby violate 'ought implies can'" (203). This reply seems somewhat vague and quick, and Di Nucci does not elaborate on it. He does consider, however, that a defender of DDE may try to avoid these problems connected to the actual intentions of the actual agents in question and answer more abstractly that one may carry out the act if the act can be accomplished at least in theory without the disqualifying intention. Yet, Di Nucci argues, this answer, too, is unhelpful since, as he believes he has established in chapter 6, the DDE "is not able to distinguish between the effects that can be brought about without necessarily intending to bring them about and the effects that cannot be brought about without necessarily intending to bring them about" (207). In short, then, DDE "cannot tell agents how they may permissibly act and it is therefore useless as an action-guiding normative principle" (207).

In Chapter 12 Di Nucci argues that DDE misleads when it comes to questions of responsibility. On his read, DDE suggests that an agent is morally responsible only for those effects that he intended and not for the merely-foreseen side effects of his actions. But, Di Nucci argues, "since the side effects were both forseen and avoidable, a plausible theory of responsibility will want to include them within the things that the agent is responsible for" (210). A proponent of DDE may respond, however, by pointing out that the fourth condition of DDE's traditional formulation -- the requirement of proportionality -- gives DDE at least some wherewithal to find fault with an agent for causing foreseeable-though-unintended harm. Di Nucci's critique here would have benefitted from a consideration of this traditional element of DDE.

Di Nucci's book is, overall, a detailed and provocative critique of this long-standing and often-used instrument of moral reasoning. Whether his arguments are fatal to DDE is debatable, but this work is certainly up to the task of provoking and advancing serious debate. The book also offers an up-to-date bibliography that will surely be helpful to those who come out of the weeds looking for more.