Ethics Without Morals: In Defence of Amorality

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Joel Marks, Ethics Without Morals: In Defence of Amorality, Routledge, 2012, 150pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415635561.

Reviewed by Timothy Schroeder, Ohio State University


A familiar style of philosophical argument goes like this: for X to exist, it must be true that P, Q, and R. But it is not true that P, Q, and R. So X does not exist. The familiar style of argument also has familiar supplementary arguments. One such argument often is that it is easy to explain why it nonetheless seems that X exists. Another is that life can go on as usual in spite of it turning out that X does not exist; this conclusion, though radical, is not as radical as it seems. A third is that more concessive interpretations of what it takes for X to exist are not acceptable.

This familiar style is worn well by Joel Marks in Ethics Without Morals. Marks argues that morality (and with it, properties such as rightness and wrongness, and related properties such as moral worth and moral blameworthiness) does not exist. Morality does not exist because, if it did exist, it would have to be a set of universal, categorical commands that are overriding in force. But there is no such set of commands. There are merely the non-universal categorical commands of each society, commands that do not override our (considered) desires. These commands of society, along with the social practices necessary to generate and sustain them (dubbed "empirical morality"), explain where we get the idea that morality itself exists. But the existence of empirical morality can itself be explained without appeal to morality. Although recognizing this fact is likely to undermine empirical morality, Marks holds that this is no cause for alarm since we would probably be better off, and certainly would not be much worse off, for recognizing that morality is a myth. Marks can see that you might try to avoid his conclusion by weakening your theory of morality, but this, he argues, would be unsatisfying.

Ethics Without Morals is set up to efficiently walk the reader through these arguments. Chapter 1 sets out the necessary conditions for the existence of morality and chapter 2 makes the argument that these conditions are not met; empirical morality is real, but morality itself is not. Chapters 3 and 4 argue that we would be no worse off, and perhaps rather better off, relative to our own preferences, if we would accept the argument set out in chapters 1 and 2. Chapter 5 tackles the question of whether some more concessive notion of morality, one less demanding than that laid out in chapter 1, might nonetheless be satisfying and defensible. And chapter 7 considers how we are to live (this is the 'ethics' of the title) without the guidance of morality; it turns out that little need change. Chapter 6 is an interesting deviation from this straightforward line of thought, to which I will return below.

Marks recognizes that he is not the first moral nihilist to write about the topic (he tips his hat to Nietzsche), not the first philosopher to criticize divine command theory (he follows Plato's Euthyphro), and not the first to criticize Kant's metaethics in either its more metaphysical guise (where it stands accused of relying on a mythical noumenon) or its more constructivist guise (where it stands accused of not having a credible construction of morality). And he recognizes that, in a very short book (just ninety-three pages), he is hardly going to lay out premises that will force a skeptical expert to admit to being wrong. So then, what does Marks think he is doing?

Reading Ethics Without Morals is like sitting down with a philosopher friend who knows he can count on you for a sympathetic hearing. "I've been thinking about something," he says, "and it's been coming together. Hear me out while I work through it." And so you sit and hear him out. You could interrupt to complain about the idea that morality has to be overriding rather than just reason-providing, or to complain that Korsgaardian meta-ethics has more resources than he is letting on, or even that Steven Pinker has a new book on violence (The Better Angels of Our Nature) in which he shows evidence from a variety of researchers suggesting that the spread of Enlightenment morality, "empirical" or otherwise, has had a substantial role in decreasing violence in the Western world -- and so we might want to be cautious before openly embracing moral nihilism, preferring instead Richard Joyce's moral fictionalism (Joyce 2002). You could interrupt at a thousand points. But why? What you're listening to is not meant to be the last word on any of the arguments.

Those who enjoy psychodynamic explanations of their colleagues' work will find it particularly worthwhile to sit down and devour Marks' book since he is very open about its being a psychological as well as a philosophical story. Marks was a longtime believer in morality, but was also for a long time wracked with moral guilt and moral anger. He was on occasion (he confesses) something of a jerk in his pursuit of what seemed to him to be morality. His conversion to amorality was also a conversion to being a person less wracked internally, and more agreeable to others. This comes out strikingly in chapter 6, the focus of which is the treatment of non-human animals. Here Marks' goal is to show that he can make as meaningful a contribution as he ever did to the discussion about the treatment of other animals (he is a dietary vegan) without relying on theses such as that animals are treated immorally when raised to be eaten. But at least as interesting (to my mind) is the way Marks displays just how angry we can get over the moral wrongs we take each other to commit in our interaction with other animals, not to mention the guilt we can feel over how we have acted in the past. And it was interesting to see that (at least for this reader) the heat of the anger was lessened when the discussion was not explicitly in moral terms. By showing in addition to telling, Marks adds generality, if not universality, to his own psychological story.

Thus, the book reads as a sort of confession of the loss of one faith and the gaining of another. Marks' newfound amoralist faith is backed by argument and evidence, but the confession is as much his point as the argumentation.

Unfortunately for both Marks and the profession, Routledge is selling the hardcover for $125. So while this would be a pleasant and stimulating book to read on an airplane, or by the fire after an afternoon of hiking, or with a group of advanced undergraduates who want to grapple with something big in ethics and whom you want to turn loose on something they can get their heads around without much support from you, the book is most likely to sit hidden on the shelf in a few libraries. Suppose, though, that you were to get hold of a copy. What might you make of it, once you had done your part and listened to Marks' engaging intellectual confession?

One thing that struck me is that Marks attributes many unwanted features to moral thinking, feeling, and action. Morality is responsible for our feeling things we do not like to feel, and for our doing things to others that they do not like done to them -- and even that we ourselves do not much like doing to them. Marks hopes that widespread adoption of his view would ameliorate these features, by eliminating moral thought. But this requires that we feel bad about eating factory farmed chickens (or for not helping parasite-infested schoolchildren in the third world, or . . .) mainly because we take our actions to be immoral. If only we took them to be, say, indifferent to intense animal suffering, we would cease to feel bad about them. This strikes me as largely incorrect. Even if I would cease to think wrongdoing possible, and so cease to be capable of something counting as guilt, I would still not want to be the sort of person who profits from the intense suffering of chickens. And, given that I have often so profited in my past, I would feel bad knowing that. So likewise, for example, when it comes to wanting others not to lie to me (at least to my mind). Even if I do not continue to be moved to punish liars by my moral desire for just punishment, I will continue to be moved to punish liars by my intense dislike of being lied to. So perhaps the personal benefits Marks has derived from ceasing to believe in the existence of morality have stemmed from something less straightforward than his emotions and actions being wholly conditioned by his specifically moral thoughts and desires.

Indeed, Marks relies on the idea that most of our thoughts and feelings and actions are not really -- in the end -- tied to the concept morality. Thus, in chapter 3, he argues that for the most part a world that did not believe in morality would be a world that went on much as usual. We would still dislike being lied to, and discourage children from being liars. We would still want people to lead self-determined lives insofar as those lives are not aimed at harming others, and so on. But it is far from clear that Marks can have it both ways. Either little changes, so that the emotional relief from guilt and anger is modest, and the behavioral relief from trying to run others' lives and punish them for their socially disruptive deeds is sporadic. Or else much changes, and we're better off in some ways -- but in part because we cease to care much about such things as distant suffering and self-actualization, the suffering of other animals, or the punishment of social norm violators.

Another thing that struck me is that Marks unintentionally makes a morality out of (Humean) practical rationality. On his view, we have various beliefs and various intrinsic desires, and we act rationally when we do what seems most likely (given what we believe) to be best for getting us what we intrinsically want (upon considered reflection). This sort of practical rationality trumps any demand made by our society or by our own confused thinking about right and wrong. So it is overriding, as Marks demands of a morality. It issues commands -- there is the rational thing to do, in a given situation, and one does something stupid in failing to do it -- as Marks also demands of a morality. It is categorical, in the sense that one does not get released from the obligation to maximize expected intrinsic desire satisfaction just because one happens not to want to maximize it. And it is universal: the same practical rationality holds for all people at all times. Or so it seems to me.

Marks is aware of how easy it would be to press him to this conclusion. His response is that practical rationality is not really categorical: it is rational for me, e.g., to write this review only because of what I desire (e.g., to participate in philosophizing). Hence the command issued to me by practical rationality -- write this review! -- is only hypothetical in the end. The command is really: write this review, if you want to participate in philosophizing.

To me, however, this sounds a bit confused. The requirement to maximize expected desire satisfaction is not one that is at all sensitive to what we intrinsically desire. Its substantive content changes, of course, depending upon what a person happens to intrinsically desire. But formally the demand is the same regardless of what one intrinsically desires, and it cannot be shrugged off by not caring about maximizing (or the like). In the same way, in Kantian moral thought the substantive content of the good will changes depending upon what a person happens to be doing, but formally the moral demand is the same and cannot be shrugged off by not caring about universalizability.

I'm sympathetic to the modern Humean theory of practical rationality, but not particularly convinced that the existence of an overriding, categorical, universal command to maximize expected desire satisfaction renders this command a moral one. Perhaps this is because I, more than Marks, think that what is most central to morality is its substantive content, not its more formal properties. Morality is a set of rules telling us to take care of each other, not to lie to each other, and so on. Suppose Marks is right, and this set of rules is not the dictate of some god, and is not the dictate of pure practical reason, indeed, is nothing more than a historically contingent set of rules arrived at, implicitly, as the Enlightenment worked its way into the popular consciousness. Then that seems to me good reason to think that "morality" is the name of one particular culture's value system, the way "bushido" was a name for a different, non-moral system and the law said to be given to Moses, complete with its requirements to stone people to death under various conditions, was yet another culture's non-moral value system.

Marks' response to this sort of undemanding conception of what morality might turn out to be is to argue briefly against many of its common forms (for instance, that no one is really a thoroughgoing cultural relativist) on the grounds that none of them quite capture what we think morality is. But this sort of argumentative strategy invites one to imagine new ways of being an undemanding realist about morality -- or reappraisal of some views (such as that of Copp 1995) that Marks does not mention in his critique of this general approach.

Ethics Without Morals does not have all the virtues that works of professional philosophy can have. But sitting down with Marks over a few cups of coffee and two afternoons was an enjoyable experience that provoked a lot of philosophical thought. It was an experience that had the virtues that conversations with interesting philosophers can have. And that is something to be said for the book.


Copp, D. 1995. Morality, Normativity, and Society. New York: Oxford University Press.

Joyce, R. 2002. The Myth of Morality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Pinker, S. 2011. The Better Angels of Our Nature: Why violence has declined. Viking.