Ethics without Principles

Placeholder book cover

Jonathan Dancy, Ethics without Principles, Oxford University Press, 2004, 240pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199270023.

Reviewed by Timothy Chappell, University of Dundee


Circumstances alter cases; shorter pants need longer braces. So the folk advise; and some ethicists seem to think it distinctively particularist advice. Evidently it can't be, because there needs to be more to moral particularism than platitude, however bracing. For this reason -- and pace a surprising number of writers who really should know better -- particularism can't just be the view that attention to moral particularities is vital; or that moral decisions should not be reached, as the usual rhetoric has it, "mechanically" or "algorithmically"; or that judgement[1] is often needed to settle hard ethical questions, or even to apply rules; or that moral insight is a contextual matter. All too often particularists charge generalists with denying these claims; when in fact these are mere truisms which no one serious disputes, particularist or generalist.

Again, if particularism is worth discussing, it cannot be the negation of this view:

There is some moral principle that settles all ethical questions (∃p ∀q (Sp, q))

For nearly everyone accepts the negation of this view. (Not, perhaps, absolutely everyone. Aldo Leopold says he thinks that promoting the wellbeing of the environment is the only thing that matters ethically; Torrbjorn Tannsjo says he thinks that promoting wellbeing is the only thing that matters ethically. As a pluralist, I am inclined to doubt that Leopold and Tannsjo really think anything of the sort; but I leave them aside here.)

Nor can it be particularism to deny this view:

For every ethical question, there is some moral principle that settles it (∀q ∃p (Sp, q))

To deny this cannot be particularism, because Elizabeth Anscombe denies it,[2] and if anyone is not a particularist, Anscombe isn't. (We might use the question "Would/ did Anscombe accept this thesis?" to test candidate-characterisations of particularism; where the answer is "Yes", as with the candidates just listed, the characterisation fails.)

So how shall we fix the content of particularism? If anyone has earned the right to fix it it must be Jonathan Dancy, who may not himself have invented the very word "particularism" -- he tells me that was Richard Hare -- but who has certainly, by his writings in the area over more than twenty years, given the term common currency in ethics. His rich and subtle new book Ethics without Principles bills itself, on the back cover, as "the definitive statement of particularist ethical theory"; so if anything is our opportunity to find out exactly what particularism amounts to, this must be it.

Here then is the formulation of particularism that Dancy's new book showcases. Generalism is the negation of this (p.7):

Particularism: the possibility of moral thought and judgement does not depend on the provision of a suitable supply of moral principles.

If we take this definition au pied de la lettre then particularism is obviously true, generalism obviously false. Of course it's possible to engage in moral thought and judgement without "moral principles" (whatever exactly they may be: more about that later). But then it's also possible to type an entire novel with your elbows, or drive from Mexico to Alaska in reverse gear. The interesting question is not whether moral thought can happen at all without principles, but whether it can be done well, or is characteristically done, without principles. So Dancy's formulation should be read non-literally, as a best-explanation sort of thesis: something like the claim that healthy moral thought and judgement does not need moral principles, and that those of us who are healthy moral agents therefore do quite well without principles already -- even if we hadn't realised it before we opened Dancy's book.

This prompts a little reflection on the social and psychological facts about the society we live in. As Hooker 2000 has emphasised, in our society, most people obviously do use (what they take to be) moral principles in their moral decision-making ("Keep your promises", "Don't steal", "Help the needy", "Drive carefully", "Don't be a racist", "Mind your own business", and so on), and expect others too to assent to and comply with such principles. Given the crucial importance of public trust, transparency, and reliable mutual expectations in structuring any complex and reasonably humane society such as our own, there is a large question, its size I think seriously underestimated by the particularists, about how this could possibly be otherwise.

So if the particularist thesis is that healthy moral agents don't need moral principles, that thesis just raises the question how many of its moral agents a society like ours can permit to be healthy. It is one thing for the particularist to say that some Harean archangel, or denizen of Sidgwick's Government House, might get along best without principles, or that the deep structure of the true ethics is particularist. It is quite another, and a much stronger claim, for him to say that ordinary folks like us might get along best without principles, or that the manifest structure of the most practicable public ethics is particularist. Maybe particularism faces a publicity problem of a kind familiar from the discussion of utilitarianism. Perhaps we should say that, even though particularism is true at the archangelic level, we do better to publicise or seek acceptance of some simpler code at the level of ordinary mortals; perhaps particularism is true, but not assertible.

Dancy's response (pp.133-134) is bullish. First, he rejects the constructivism that he detects behind the criticism: morality is no mere "social device" or "human institution that has got set up for a purpose", like the World Bank. But, his critic might reply, even a morality that is entirely discovered, not invented, must say something about how best to achieve social co-operation; social reliance on principles looks like an economical way to achieve it. Naturally, Dancy disputes this too:

… we can perfectly well rely on people by and large to do what is right in the circumstances. We don't need principles to tell them what to do, or to determine what is right, or to tell us what they are likely to do, any more than we need principles of rationality to be in place before we can begin to rely on people by and large to act sensibly.

The generalist agent Gerry will be predictable (if he behaves himself) because he accepts a set of moral principles; the particularist agent Patty will be predictable (if she behaves herself) because she reliably assesses the relevant moral reasons correctly. And if you object that Patty will only be predictable to others who know how such reasons-assessments are likely to go, Dancy can retort that Gerry will only be predictable to others who know what his principles are.

However, it remains easier to predict what follows from a set of generalist principles than to predict what follows from a set of particularist reasons. This is partly because of the particularists' insistence on the reversible-valence claim -- the claim that any (or, sometimes, almost any) fact can in principle count not only as a reason for some action, but also as a reason against that action, and again as no reason at all one way or the other. This reversible-valence claim is clearly important for Dancy, but -- as he himself remarks, p.2 -- it is hard to know how to discuss it without looking at a lot of detailed examples, and hoping that we will share intuitions about those examples; for this reason I shall not discuss it much here.

Another reason why predictability is easier for generalists than particularists arises from the fact that, apparently, there is something that the generalist can explain about right-making that the particularist can't. Suppose Patty and Gerry both keep a promise in C, and that keeping the promise in C is right. What makes it right? The particularist will typically say (roughly) that keeping the promise in C is right because it is favoured by the way the reasons present in C interact with each other. The generalist can say exactly the same, of course; but the generalist can say something more, and something less nebulous (and therefore more useful for predictive purposes), about why the reasons present in C interact with each other to produce the verdict that keeping the promise in C is right. They do that, he can say, because promise-keeping is generally right: because there is a principle that tells us to keep promises, because no special factor or other general principle is present in C to override this general principle, and because where a general principle is not opposed by a special factor or another general principle, it predictably wins out.

The particularist might try to shadow these moves; or he might tell us instead that these moves are simply unnecessary. (Cp. Dancy's remark, quoted above, that "We don't need principles to tell [people] what to do".) Let's look at the second option first. In reading Ethics without Principles one frequently has the feeling that Ockham's Razor is being applied to the appurtenances of generalism, and this is a case in point. Dancy's idea seems to be the rather Wittgensteinian thought -- the ghost of Wittgenstein was more visible in Moral Reasons than it is in Ethics without Principles, but has not I think entirely evaporated -- that nothing is added by appealing to principles to explain how Gerry arrives at his moral verdict. It is as if we were to explain the action of a dose of chloroform by recounting the full chemical story of what this dose of chloroform did to this human metabolism on this occasion -- and then adding that chloroform has a dormitive virtue.

That Dancy's objection to generalism is analogous to standard objections to dormitive virtues may be an idea worth pursuing, especially given Dancy's ambition to expand explanatory holism beyond the moral realm. In fact, it might be more accurate to say that Dancy wants to expand explanatory holism into the moral realm, since he often says in the book -- and has said to me, in person -- that the truth of explanatory holism is taken for granted everywhere else except in morals, so that the moral atomist needs to give some account of why the ethical realm behaves so differently from everything else. Perhaps a little reflection on my chloroform example will help to clarify the main issues here.

How does explanation work in the chloroform story? It certainly has a particularist side, as witness the obvious appropriateness of the word "story" in this context.[3] To explain what the chloroform did, we develop a narrative about what, in particular, happened this time; just as we might explain how a reason (say) to keep a promise operated on a particular occasion. The particularist is also obviously right to say that all sorts of factors could complicate, annul, or perhaps even reverse the operation of chloroform on other occasions. There are possible stories[4] in which chloroform is added to another dormitive drug and reacts with it to produce something neutral like water, or indeed to produce something that is actually a stimulant like sal ammoniac: so when I am telling one of these stories and say "… and then I put some chloroform into the mix", you had better not infer that my action increased the chances that my patient (victim?) was put to sleep. Maybe it had no effect on those chances; maybe it actually decreased them.

So far, so particularist. But let's look more closely at the particular narrative that gets told. "I applied liquid chloroform to a swab which I held to his mouth and he inhaled the vapours that the swab gave off, and this chloroform vapour traveled via his bloodstream to his brain, where it rapidly affected his central nervous system, causing loss of reflexes, diminished sensation, and loss of unitary consciousness." If the particularist is right, this little story (or something like it: we don't need the full chemical and physiological details here, and anyway, I don't know them) should not only be capable of explaining the action of the chloroform; it should be capable of explaining it completely. (An explanation is complete if and only if, once it has been given, any request for further explanation would be deemed out of place by a competent expert.) Now our little story is indeed a complete explanation; but the reason why is bad news for the particularist.

To see this, contrast a second story: "I applied liquid honey to a swab which I held to his mouth, he inhaled the vapours that the swab gave off, and this honey vapour traveled via his bloodstream to his kidneys, where it set up a rapid allergic reaction which caused loss of unitary consciousness." The first explanation would not prompt a doctor, or other competent expert, to ask for any further explanations; for in the first explanation everything happens as usual. The second explanation, by contrast, will prompt a doctor, or other competent expert, to ask for further explanations -- just because it is so scientifically bizarre. ("Honey isn't volatile, so why was the honey giving off vapour in any quantity? Why did it go straight to his kidneys--is his arterial system malformed? An allergic reaction to honey? I never heard of that before" … etc.) These requests for further explanation all focus on what is unusual -- the honey's strange volatility, the man's odd venous plumbing, the rarity of a honey allergy. Further explanation of these oddities will be completed, if indeed it can be, when it has reduced these anomalies to what is not unusual: to the more or less standard operation of some or other underlying factors.

The moral is that complete explanations in science are at least implicitly general. A singular narrative can indeed be a complete explanation, as the particularists are keen to point out; but only against a background of assumptions about the usual, characteristic, natural ("default"?) operation of chloroform.[5] The chloroform story is a complete explanation only because it is implicit in it that this is how chloroform characteristically operates; without that natural-regularity assumption (as I shall call it), the chloroform story would no more be a complete explanation than the honey story is. It can, therefore, only make things clearer to bring these implicit assumptions out into the open, by stating them explicitly: as we might by, for instance, adding the words "as usual" after every comma in my statement of the chloroform story. To put it another way, dormitive virtues have escaped Ockham's Razor, and it looks like scientific explanations have their generalist side as well as their particularist side. As Dancy himself repeatedly stresses, there is no reason why moral explanations should function any differently. Pari passu, therefore, they can be seen as depending on ethical-regularity assumptions.

Dancy (pp.111-117) recognises and discusses this possibility, as presented in "Mad Dogs and Englishmen", a well known paper that I have been urging Margaret Little and Mark Lance to publish for years now. Dancy argues, however, that ethical-regularity assumptions would not count as principles. Why not? Because (pp.116-117) principles must (a) determine and (b) explain the moral status of every action; (c) must be learnable, and (d) must "be capable of functioning as a guide to action in a new case". But ethical-regularity assumptions would not (a) determine nor (b) explain the moral status of every action; nor (d) would they provide a "guide to the exceptional cases"; therefore, ethical-regularity assumptions are not principles.

This passage is interesting, because it helps us to cope with a surprising fact about Ethics without Principles: that so far as I can see, the book contains no explicit definition of its central target-term "principle". However, if (a-d) represent what Dancy is rejecting under the name "generalism" or "an ethic of principles", and if particularism is the denial of an ethics based on principles of the sort outlined by (a-d), then we have the surprising result that one of Dancy's own characterisations of particularism fails the Anscombe Test. We saw on my p.1, footnote 2, that not even the arch-generalist Anscombe thinks that there are moral principles that determine or explain the moral status of every action. By criteria (a-d), therefore, even Anscombe counts as a particularist!

In order to locate a serious opposition, Dancy needs a less extreme target; someone who believes, say, that there are moral principles in the sense that there are rules which (a) determine and (b) explain the moral status of most actions, (c) are learnable, and (d) can function as guides to action in some (but not all) new cases. But this is exactly the sense in which we could say[6] that what Little and Lance believe in are principles.

So it turns out, I think, that explanation, both in the scientific and in the moral case, does need a suitable supply of generalistic principles after all. Perhaps -- cp. my reversing-to-Alaska point, above -- it is not outright impossible to run any scientific explanations without natural-regularity assumptions. But it does look very much as if scientific discourse will find it difficult to function healthily without a suitable supply of lawlike generalisations like "Chloroform is volatile", "Inhaled gases move quickly into the bloodstream", "Whatever is in the bloodstream usually affects the brain first", etc. As before, Dancy's own analogy suggests that the same will hold in ethics too. But that result, so far as I can see, spells outright victory for the generalist.

Unless, of course, the particularist can make something of the other option I noted above, and show how he too can avail himself of these moves without admitting principles. Here we come back again to the question what principles are. Suppose, this time, we take p.76 as our cue, where Dancy writes -- perhaps implying that he doesn't care how we conceive of moral principles? -- that "Moral principles, however we conceive of them, all seem to be in the business of specifying reasons as general reasons" (first emphasis added).

This suggests that a moral principle is a rule that tells you that what is a reason in one particular case is a reason in all or most similar particular cases, defeasibly or indefeasibly, where "similar" is read in a sufficiently wide and inclusive way to do two things: (a) avoid reduction to the triviality that exactly similar situations generate exactly similar reasons, and (b) allow for the substantive fact that typical generalists take the feature that a promise has been made to count as a feature that makes cases that share it similar cases. Natural-regularity assumptions of the sort described above would be principles in this sense (though, of course, scientific not moral). If my argument so far is correct, that already suggests the awkwardness of trying to do without them. But perhaps we can work up a feasible particularist stand-in for such principles from the favouring/ enabling/ intensifying distinction that Dancy makes central to his highly sophisticated theory of contributory reasons?[7]

The idea would be that some reasons are such (1) that they favour (or disfavour) certain actions, and (2) that no other factor disables them. (A disabling factor is the opposite of an enabling factor; Dancy rightly insists that disablers and enablers, and likewise intensifiers and attenuators, are not themselves reasons.) The puzzle here, of course, is precisely whether, and why, any such reason generalises. Suppose, for instance, that there is a reason which (1) disfavours a particular act of killing an innocent, and (2) is not disabled by any other factor. And suppose we even make so bold as to say that (so far as we can see) this reason or one like it will (1) disfavour every imaginable act of killing an innocent, and that (2) nothing could disable the reason which disfavours all such acts. How, and on what basis, is a particularist to say this? The alternatives seem to be mystery or covert generalism. Either it just so happens -- by a sort of astounding cosmic fluke -- that each act of killing an innocent is morally disfavoured by a non-disabled reason. Or else it happens for a reason, and the reason is expressible as a rule that what is a reason in one case of killing the innocent is a reason, defeasible or indefeasible, in all or most similar cases of killing the innocent. But this rule -- compare my definition above -- is no more and no less than a moral principle. Once more, the particularist seems to be in trouble.

Of course, as Dancy often points out, the depth of the trouble may depend on how many such moral principles there are, and how central they will have to be to the operation of a healthy moral consciousness. For my part, the comparison with science makes me think that the answers are going to be, respectively, that there are lots of principles in this sense, and that they will be very central. But now a particularist who wants to disagree with me will only be saying that there aren't so many principles, and that they aren't that central; in other words, the difference between particularism and generalism will have become no more than a matter of degree. (Dancy p.117: "Perhaps in the long term it will be shown that both particularism and generalism occupy extreme positions of some sort and that the true view lies between them.") Maybe that's how the debate ought to end; but it certainly didn't start that way.

I close with some brief thoughts about the charge of moral laxity, a charge that one sometimes hears made against particularists, and of which Dancy has a short but interesting discussion. It would be a mere libel to suggest that particularists, as such, are necessarily morally lax persons, or that their theory is bound to engender a slippery anything-goes outlook in normative ethics. What is true, I think, and does count in a less crude way against particularism, is this: that all human beings except the most angelic ones are routinely tempted to seek out deliberative routes that go from bad impulses, via special pleading, to rotten actions. Just as the point, or one main point, of a legal system is to block off as inadmissible some routes of argument from legal principles to legal decisions, so that not anything goes in law, so the point, or one main point, of a normative ethics is to impose a certain sort of deliberative discipline in the society and the individuals to which it applies. I mean the kind of deliberative discipline that is often registered colloquially by phrases like "End of story": "He's my friend -- end of story"; "I won't tell lies to my own husband -- end of story"; "But that would be murder -- end of story"; and so on. As we might say, such remarks register the impact of a moral principle on a conscience. Of course, the agent says to himself, I could do that, and certainly there would be something to be gained by doing it; however, I hold a moral principle that rules it out -- and that's that. Beyond a certain point, we refuse to go on being more and more holistic in our assessment of what we ought to do; and a good thing too, because, in the end, there is simply too much potentially relevant moral information out there for us to process. For limited creatures like us, who have to get on and do something before we die, what Dancy calls "atomism" -- the end-of-story impulse -- would be psychologically and practically inevitable even if it was not morally advisable; but unless particularism is true, it's morally advisable as well.

Perhaps it does not need to be said that I would not have spent so much time thinking about Dancy's fine book, even to disagree with it, if I had not been sure that it deserved at least this much attention. It is a hugely rewarding and interesting read, at the cutting edge of contemporary debate in the area: truly a book that cannot be ignored. For my own part, I look forward to continuing to enjoy and be instructed by Ethics without Principles for years to come, even while I see no sign of convergence between what I think must be right, and what its author thinks.[8]


Anscombe 1958: E.Anscombe, "Modern Moral Philosophy", Philosophy 1958.

Chappell (forthcoming): T.Chappell, "The variety of life and the unity of practical wisdom", in T.Chappell, ed., Values and Virtues. Oxford: Oxford University Press. (Draft available from author on request.)

Crisp 2000: "Particularising particularism", pp.23-47 in B.Hooker and M.Little, edd., Moral Particularism. Oxford: Blackwell.

Dancy 1993: Moral Reasons. Oxford: Blackwell.

Hooker 2000: "Moral Particularism: wrong and bad", pp.1-22 in B.Hooker and M.Little, edd., Moral Particularism. Oxford: Blackwell's.

Mark Lance and Margaret Little (unpublished): "Mad Dogs and Englishmen."

[1] For want of a better word. I argue in Chappell (forthcoming) that phronêsis is not a better word.

[2] Anscombe 1958: 39: "there is an area [of normative ethics] where it is not because of any gap [in our best current theories], but is in principle the case, that there is no account [of what is morally right] except by way of examples: and that is where the canon is 'what's reasonable': which is of course not a canon". Cp. Crisp 2000: 16: "The claim that practical generalisations run out may be accepted by ethical theorists of any stripe."

[3] Sometimes particularists take story-telling explanations to be a forte of their theory; I won't consider here how accessible or otherwise such explanations might be to generalists. In Moral Reasons, which I also reviewed once upon a time, "narrative" was one of Dancy's favourite words; in Ethics without Principles, the word has dropped out of the index, and rarely appears in the text. I'm not sure why.

[4] By "possible" I mean "epistemically possible relative to my information-state". For all I know, such stories may be physically possible. Even if they're not, presumably they're metaphysically or at least logically possible.

[5] The kind of regularities I have in mind -- and which perhaps Dancy's word "default" is meant to capture -- don't have to be statistical: "Eggs turn into chickens" is true as a regularity-claim of this sort, even though statistically most eggs don't turn into chickens. (Little and Lance use a similar example.)

[6] "We could say": of course, Lance and Little describe themselves as particularists. But Dancy thinks they slightly misdescribe themselves; and I agree.

[7] Contributory reasons are the only sort of moral reasons that Dancy believes in: overall reasons are not further reasons, but functions of the contributory reasons that apply. For if overall reasons were further reasons, then they might (according to particularism) have reversible polarity; but it would be an embarrassment for the overall reason "This is the right thing to do" to have reversible polarity. Also, it would be "double-counting" to see overall reasons as part of the mix from which they emerge.

As a generalist, I agree with Dancy's denial of independent overall reasons. So unless I am confused, this denial does not entail particularism or holism, nor strongly support them as against generalism or atomism. Dancy apparently thinks that particularists/ holists are especially good, and generalists/ atomists especially bad, at making sense of contributory reasons. I don't see why they should be.

[8] Thanks for their help to Simon Kirchin, Mike Ridge, and Nick Zangwill.