Europe: A Nietzschean Perspective

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Elbe, Stefan, Europe: A Nietzschean Perspective, Routledge, 2003, 176pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415369754.

Reviewed by Tracy B. Strong, University of California, San Diego


Nietzsche wrote in Beyond Good and Evil (paragraph 256) that “Europe wants to become one” and developments in Europe during the last century seem to bear out this prediction, as, indeed, they do other of his predictions, such as that the twentieth century would see wars “the like of which [had] never been seen.” The contemporary question of the unity of Europe was given impetus by the events leading to the Second World War, the need to respond to the Cold War, and the gradual growth of apparent American hegemony. Contemporary developments in and of the European Union appear only the most recent embodiment of an idea of Europe as a single cultural and political entity.

The question of the unity of Europe, it should also be said, is not new. One has only to invoke the importance of the Catholic Church (itself originally modeled to some degree on that of the Roman Empire) as providing a paradigm for spiritual and temporal identity. Somewhat later, in the XVIIth and XVIIIth centuries in Europe, the community of scientists and scholars constituted itself into a very virtual “republic of letters.” This was again thought of as a European identity. When Pierre Bayle, the great Protestant thinker, having fled France where he had been condemned, launched from Holland the most prestigious scientific review of the period, he called it: “Nouvelles de la République des Lettres. In 1729, one of his disciples had already given a definition of this unity, one that anticipates Rousseau’s definition of a just polity: “It is a state that extends in all states, a republic where each member, in perfect independence, recognizes only the law that he himself prescribes to himself.”

So the idea of Europe is neither new nor without broader political implications. Indeed, writers as apparently diverse as Martin Heidegger and Jürgen Habermas have further argued that as a self-conscious entity Europe has a particular and singular role to play in world history. The idea of Europe has thus reappeared with a new force in contemporary times, as Stefan Elbe makes very clear in an excellent analysis of contemporary writings on “Europe.” Yet what is exactly that role? From what might it spring? And is it in fact being realized? The question is all the more pressing in our times, for the end of the Cold War seems to have removed an external and somewhat artificial barrier to the unity of Europe – as the ongoing expansion of the membership of the European Union seems to make evident.

These are the issues at the core of this book, issues that Stefan Elbe seeks to explore through the lens of Nietzsche’s thinking about “Europe.” The book thus works on two levels, on the one hand as an analysis of the idea of “Europe” and on the other as an investigation of Nietzsche’s thought. The major achievement of the book is to have shown that Nietzsche’s work is in fact a fruitful approach to a range of social-scientific questions about political development. The major claim of the book is that Nietzsche gives a picture of what Europe could and must be if it is to be truly a Europe in our times.

Elbe’s starting point is the disjuncture between the institutional developments that have taken place (such as the provisions of the Maastricht Treaty and the Euro) and the apparent lack of a deeply meaningful idea of what Europe signifies, about what Stanley Hoffmann noted in a 1994 Daedalus article as a lack of “spiritual vitality.” Such a lack means that whatever Europe means beyond certain shared practices making for economic efficiency is simply unclear.

In Elbe’s presentation of Nietzsche’s analysis, there are, as one might say, two independent variables. These are, on the one hand, “the death of God” and thus long-term trends of secularization in and of society and, on the other, nationalism in one or another of its contemporary forms. For Elbe, the death of God signifies that in the present age those structures of meaning that had given a kind of unity to Europe in the past increasingly no longer hold any effective sway. Elbe emphasizes the decline in the salience of Christianity in contemporary Europe as a framework for meaning. As Thomas Pangle noted over twenty years ago, one cannot simply remove God from the equation of a human culture without certain consequences. Nor, Elbe argues, will science and the belief in the “progress” of human knowledge provide a substitute. He notes both Nietzsche’s and Max Weber’s argument (in “Science as a Vocation”) that whatever science can provide, it will not provide meaning to its or any other enterprise.

The other variable is nationalism, which Elbe reads with Nietzsche as a response to the “wider cultural crisis of secularization” (p. 45). Drawing an interesting parallel on but also extending work such as that of Benedict Anderson, Elbe argues that nationalism is an eventually dangerous and problematic response to a need for meaning, a need especially salient after the death of God and embodied, often with great violence, in the modern state.

Some – such as Jean Monnet and Stanley Hoffmann (who would probably resist having his name linked with that of Monnet) – have urged the establishment of a “common institutional framework” (p. 84) from which a unified Europe might develop. Elbe argues rather that such a vision merely rewrites the old idea of the state on a larger level and thus furthers the “incomplete nihilism” already apparent in nationalism. It follows from this that for Nietzsche (and Elbe) the attempt to formulate an “ideal” for “Europe” is merely to further the kinds of dynamics inherent in the “incomplete nihilism” consequent to the death of God and the hollowing out of existence in secularization. Elbe’s proposal is that any viable “Europe” would have to respond precisely to the absence of meaning not by formulating a new one (whatever that might mean), nor in the elaboration of a “fixed and finite set of attributes” (p. 115). Rather the idea of the “good European” that would be responsive to the developments of our time (the death of God and nationalism) would require the development of persons shaped by the “experience of a profound and creative existential freedom.” Elbe writes: “If Europeanization is ultimately understood in Nietzsche’s sense of ’good Europeans’, i.e. as provoking a profound experience of freedom amongst fellow human beings without seeking to fix in advance the precise nature of their identity, then the inability to find a more meaningful representation of Europe along the lines suggested by Hoffmann and others need also not amount to an obstacle for the European union” (pp. 118-119).

Such is, in very brief form, the basic argument of Elbe’s book. I should note that he moves back and forth from an analysis of Nietzsche to contemporary social science with considerable ease and learning. Indeed, I chose above to evoke social-science jargon precisely to call attention to the fact that a major achievement of the book from the point of view of Nietzsche scholarship is to show how importantly concerned Nietzsche was with political and social matters, a claim that has been advanced for well over the last twenty-five years but still threatens to disappear among other more literary or narrowly philosophical approaches (which is not to deny their interest).

What might one say to Elbe’s analysis? First, there is a striking omission. In 1947, Bruno Snell, then Rector of the University of Kiel, wrote in Die Entdeckung des Geistes that the question confronting “us” is “if we are to be European, we must know what were the Greeks.” Snell, who had managed to remain in Germany during the period of National Socialism and still keep his hands and his soul clean, was concerned that Christianity had not provided an adequate resistance to the forces inherent in Nazism and sought to elaborate an alternative vision in the legacy (or legacies) of Ancient Greece. Elbe pays no attention to whatever resources the Greeks might provide, or the degree to which they shape Nietzsche’s thought about contemporary questions. I am not, I should emphasize, implying that Nietzsche sought to “go back” to the Greeks, merely that they provided a structural model of how to deal with some of the questions that Elbe raises.

Second, in an omission that one can only imagine has to be purposive, Elbe considers not at all the kind of continuation of the “Enlightenment Project” that we associate with the “constitutional patriotism” elaborated in the work of Jürgen Habermas. Who else, Habermas asks, “but Europe could draw from its own traditions the insight, the energy, the courage of vision — everything that would be necessary to strip from the premises of a blind compulsion to system maintenance and system expansion their power to shape our mentality.” Elbe’s Nietzschean perspective is quite different from that of Habermas, but it seems to me necessary that he confront it to show why it is an inadequate alternative. This is all the more striking as in his conclusion Elbe draws explicit parallels to Nietzsche’s project and that of the Enlightenment (p. 118), which Habermas, of course, does also. One of the requirements, it seems to me, of reading Nietzsche as a social scientist (if I may exaggerate just a little) is that one consider alternative explanations.

Third, although he acknowledges the significance of political institutions in the development of the idea of “Europe,” Elbe seems to me to pay inadequate attention to the degree to which human life cannot be understood without reference to these institutions and conventions. Thus for him the opposition is between “abstract ideas” and “persons” (p. 106) – he properly rejects the former but fails to elaborate the latter. It is quite clear that Nietzsche writes in such a way so as apparently to lend himself to a focus on the “minds of people” (ibid) but I am not persuaded that this is in fact the right way to read him (or so I have argued). But if it is the right way to read him, then Elbe needs, in his pursuit of what a post-nihilistic Europe would look like, either to critique Nietzsche here – one would imagine by the invocation of at least the spirit of Max Weber – or to show why that is unnecessary.

Lastly, the words “National Socialism” or “Nazism” do not appear in the index to this book, nor are they discussed. I think this a problematic omission because I am struck by the fact that for the present generation (certainly of Americans but to a great degree also of Europeans) the experiences leading up to World War II are as distant as are, say, those of the French Revolution. What this means is that the constraints placed on thought by virtue of the perceived need “never to let ’it’ happen again” (constraints that seem to me for instance to have controlled much of liberal political theory since the Second War) are in the process of eroding and, indeed, of disappearing. One could argue that such a development is necessary for the path to be opened to the non-identity based autonomy that Elbe seeks for Europeans, but much more is opened also – the source of some of Habermas’s anxieties about the figures he considers in The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity. There is, perhaps in the end, a much broader and potentially more complex, even dangerous, set of developments at play here than Elbe allows.

This said, Europe: A Nietzschean Perspective is a very fine book indeed: it teaches us something about the current debate over Europe and its futures; it teaches us something about Nietzsche. To have accomplished the two together is a very substantial achievement.