European Aesthetics: A Critical Introduction from Kant to Derrida

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Robert L. Wicks, European Aesthetics: A Critical Introduction from Kant to Derrida, Oneworld, 2013, 347pp., $30 (pbk), ISBN 9781851688197.

Reviewed by Nick Wiltsher, University of Leeds


Robert L. Wicks takes on the daunting task of summarising and analysing 200 years of European thought on aesthetics, and for the most part, succeeds admirably. The book presents a chronological procession of 16 philosophers, each of whom is accorded a chapter in which the key elements of their thinking are pithily sketched and thoughtfully criticised, with a thematic focus on the socio-political uses to which art and aesthetic theory may be put. As the subtitle suggests, and as Wicks is keen to stress, the book "does not provide a detailed history of aesthetics . . . as might be written by a historian" (5). Rather than giving a comprehensive survey of the subject, Wicks concentrates on philosophers whose work fits his theme. In addition to figures who are already enshrined in the canon of Anglo-American philosophy, he includes well-known but sometimes ill-regarded philosophers such as Derrida and Deleuze, and makes a compelling case for their contributions to contemporary aesthetic theory. In addition, Wicks pursues a thread of discussion concerning the fluctuating regard in which reason has been held over his chosen period.

Wicks arranges his chosen philosophers in a linear canon, divided into two parts, each comprising eight chapters. Part I covers the period 1790-1900, beginning with Kant and progressing through Schiller, Hegel, Marx, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Kierkegaard, and Freud. In Part II, which takes us up to 1980, Wicks discusses Benjamin, Adorno, Heidegger, Gadamer, Barthes, Foucault, Derrida, and (despite his subtitle) Deleuze. An introduction and conclusion top and tail the book. In this sequential framework, Wicks ably situates each philosopher in relation to his predecessors, tracing the development of ideas about aesthetics across the period. He illustrates how each of his subjects responds to what has come before, in doing so drawing out the themes with which he is concerned.

Thus, though avowedly not a historian's history, this is still a history of sorts: an unabashed example of great-man historiography, and I emphasise the gendered term here. The 16 selected philosophers are all men, and the four-page index of names includes about a dozen women. It might be that all the significant thinkers in European aesthetics in the last 200 years were men. More likely, it might be that conceptualising a history of anything in terms of 'significant figures' leads us too easily into consideration of canonical males. This may seem a dreary complaint, but it is only dreary because it keeps being made, and it keeps being made because it is important. I am not at all accusing Wicks of sexism or misogyny; rather, the invitation is to consider the possibly deleterious effects of apparently innocent approaches, and the alternative effects a different approach might have yielded.

I will return to this invitation when addressing the book's thematic elements, but remaining with the history for now, it is worth emphasising what a fine job Wicks does of giving clear, accurate, and engaging accounts of a wide range of approaches to aesthetics. He is particularly good, where necessary, at situating aesthetic theories in the context of more general metaphysical or epistemological theories; the chapter on Hegel is an excellent example of this. No doubt serious scholars of any of the philosophers covered could have cavils, but the unspecialised reader is richly rewarded, and so, as an introduction, the book is a success. That said, the general reader might justifiably wish for even more reward. At times, the discussion is condensed to a high degree, and positions and arguments are not given time to breathe. The chapter on Heidegger, for example, might have benefited from more thorough explanations of what a "poetic" consciousness amounts to, and of the difference between "mechanical truth" and "truth as disclosure" (202-206). Further, Wicks does not engage in niceties of interpretation or scholarship, preferring to present his reading of each philosopher without discussion. Though this is a legitimate approach in an introductory work, it is an area where the complaint about the exclusion of women might have been partially addressed; there are shelves of excellent secondary literature to which more reference might have been made.

Talking of references, another dreary complaint: there are far, far too few of them in this book. Whether this is an editorial or authorial matter I do not know, but the general reader and serious scholar alike are manifestly ill-served by (for example) a chapter on Hegel which contains not one specific reference to any page among the 1200 or so that make up his lectures on fine art (as Wicks tells us, 56). An introduction should send the reader to the original texts, and so if a book like this is to be of use to a student of any sort, it is not enough to tell her that Hegel said P; she needs to be told also where Hegel said P.

More references would also help the reader attribute blame in the occasional passages where things seem to go awry, such as the apparent conflation of 'artistic' with 'artificial' in the chapter on Foucault (250), and the jejune account of perception given in the chapter on Barthes (234-237). Similarly, they would help to sort the occasions when Wicks is reporting from those when he is extrapolating. For example, we are told that Kant's aesthetics allow for "the rhetorical use of the sublime", and the "beautification of immoral content", with the attendant dangers that art or artistic techniques might be employed in the service of propaganda and perversion (35-37). This is an interesting idea, and not one I remember encountering explicitly in the Third Critique; my guess, then, is that this is an implication Wicks draws from what Kant says. I might be wrong; it might be something that Kant writes and Wicks reports. But I shouldn't need to guess about whom to credit here.

These points aside, the book's historical and summary elements are valuable and enjoyable. To pick one highlight, the chapter on Deleuze does an excellent job of making his dense and difficult work accessible, in the process doing much to bring his ideas within the ambit of contemporary Anglo-American aesthetics. The book's thematic elements are similarly thought-provoking, though here one sometimes feels a tension between the approach Wicks chooses and the themes he pursues.

Wicks' organising theme is the use of art, and more specifically its use as a tool of social engineering or social disruption; as he puts it, "the roles of beauty and art in connection with morality and with a variety of conceptions of the good society" (7). Very roughly, the thinkers in the first half of the book see art as a tool for creating a morally good world, whereas those in the second half are concerned with art's potential to undermine or reinforce hegemony or oppression (there are exceptions in both parts, but this is the general outlook). Here, we see again that the book is not a straightforward survey of the history of aesthetics. Many topics that have been of central concern to aestheticians -- for example, the ontology of works of art, the nature of aesthetic experience, the relations between art and expression, and so on -- are sidelined or excluded altogether, along with aestheticians whose principal interests do not accord with the theme (Ingarden and Dufrenne are two examples). Wicks expresses the hope that positions on such questions will emerge in discussion of the central theme, but this is not often the case (7).

This is not in itself a criticism; Wicks is quite right to choose the philosophers who fit his thematic focus, and the book is all the better for having such a focus. The problem comes where Wicks selects thinkers who do not obviously have a great deal to say on the theme, and tries to force them to say something about it. The focus slips in particular in the chapters on Freud, Gadamer, Derrida, and Kierkegaard. The first three seem far more concerned with interpreting art rather than using it, and the latter chapter is preoccupied mostly with discussion of a Kierkegaardian "aesthetic attitude". It is almost as if Wicks felt compelled to include chapters on these significant philosophers, and then further compelled to fit them to the theme. Again, he writes well about their ideas, but those ideas seem out of place.

Conversely, some of the philosophers Wicks includes bear obvious relevance to his theme, but less obvious relevance to the subject of aesthetics. The thinnest chapters here, in terms of the aesthetic thinking on offer rather than thematic relevance, are those on Marx and Foucault; and they are thin because, as Wicks admits, neither actually has much to say about aesthetics. Granted, there is a fecund school of Marxist criticism, and there is a useful Foucauldian approach, and both these fit nicely with the theme of the uses of art to build or to question societies. Indeed, it would have been remiss to write about the use of art as a socio-political tool without mentioning Marxism. But the reader and the theme may have been better served by chapters on schools of thought rather than the thought of these individuals.

When the focus is strong, Wicks does have much of interest to say about the progression of European thought on aesthetics, from the Modern idea that art can be used to inculcate moral virtue and social order, to the 20th-century suspicion that its use as such serves only dubious interests, and the countervailing assertion of art's autonomy, initially from ethics and politics and later from its own creators. The complementary chapters on Benjamin and Adorno form an especially strong and satisfying pair on this topic.

Wicks also has a second theme, the oscillating fortunes of reason, and here again we might wonder if the historiographical approach adopted is well-matched with the thematic concern. The structure of the book encourages the reader to dip in and out: to treat it, effectively, as an anthology of separate essays on several thinkers. But this would be to miss out on the reason theme, which develops slowly over the course of the book, remaining at times implicit and at other times coming to the fore.

Wicks's main thesis is that the French Revolution and the subsequent Terror precipitated a crisis of reason, as philosophers struggled to understand how their beloved principles of enlightened rationality had issued in such brutality. The history of European aesthetics since then, he thinks, can be construed as a succession of attempts to either defend the respectability of reason by finding rational ways to use art in social improvement, or alternatively develop non-rational means of expression as a way of confounding the hegemonic and oppressive tendencies inherent in the relentless application of reason. In his conclusion, Wicks argues that this antagonistic posturing, the positioning of each theory for or against reason, has been a mistake: "the perceived need to make a single-minded choice has been misleading theorists for at least two centuries" (316). Instead, we should recognise that "each style is two-faced" -- that is, both reason and non-reason can be used for or against "freedom", or in the "interests of oppression" -- "and as such, neither can be accorded prime responsibility for social ills" (312). He then advances his own view and vision of "an art of trust and social criticism", trust being "independent of rationality and non-rationality [and] consistent with them both" (321).

There is much here that is interesting and suggestive, but it really needs a lot more development and defence than it gets. For a start, Wicks never really gives us a characterisation of what "reason" and "rationality" are, nor of their negated counterparts. Matters are complicated by the fact that "rational" and "non-rational" are sometimes referred to directly, and sometimes used as qualifiers. We have, for example, rational modes of expression, rational modes of enquiry, rational styles, and so forth. Wicks does persistently use "scientific thinking" to refer to "reason", and sometimes refers to "instrumental" or "mechanical" reason, but this does no more than intimate what he has in mind. So it is hard to evaluate his claim that aesthetics has been the battleground of reason.

For another thing, much of what Wicks says quite quickly about how reason has been used and abused, and how we should progress, could do with elaboration and explanation. For example, he seems consistently to associate "reason" with the idea that art can inculcate ethical virtue and uphold social order, and "irrationality" with the idea that art is a tool of social disruption and resistance. I take his point that, in many of the philosophers he discusses, these associations are indeed made; but I would have liked to hear more about why they have been made, why they are wrong, and why it is necessary to find a position that is accepting of both reason and irrationality.

Finally, the position advanced at the end of the book comes as something of a surprise, given that the theme has been submerged for much of foregoing discussion. The great majority of the book does not have the feel of something building towards a conclusion, and so the reader is left unsure what exactly "an art that emphasises trust" (320) amounts to, why trust is both consistent and independent of rationality and irrationality, how art can be used to promote trust, and why we should want to inculcate this virtue above all others. Wicks clearly has some intriguing things to say on this subject, and it would be very interesting to read about them in greater depth and detail, but the presentation of his ideas here sells them short.

European Aesthetics must have been a considerable undertaking, and many readers will be grateful to Wicks for his efforts. It is a good introduction to the philosophers discussed and will serve well as a companion to any course on aesthetics, especially given its reasonable price. More advanced students and scholars will also find value here. I hope to see the thematic and argumentative aspects of the book developed in more detail in subsequent work.