European Philosophy of Science -- Philosophy of Science in Europe and the Viennese Heritage (Institute Vienna Circle Yearbook, Volume 17) & Die Europäische Wissenschaftsphilosophie und das Wiener Erbe (Institute Vienna Circle Institute Yearbook, Volume 18)

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Maria Carla Galavotti, Elisabeth Nemeth, and Friedrich Stadler (eds.), European Philosophy of Science -- Philosophy of Science in Europe and the Viennese Heritage (Institute Vienna Circle Yearbook, Volume 17), Springer, 2014, 409pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319018980.

Elisabeth Nemeth and Friedrich Stadler (eds.), Die Europäische Wissenschaftsphilosophie und das Wiener Erbe (Institute Vienna Circle Yearbook, Volume 18), Springer, 2013, 199pp., $49.99 (pbk), ISBN 9783709115787.

Reviewed by A. W. Carus


These volumes (henceforth 17 and 18, when referred to individually) document the proceedings of the twentieth-anniversary conference of the Institute Vienna Circle (IVC), the brainchild of Friedrich Stadler, under whose redoubtable leadership it has succeeded in establishing itself as an integral part of the University of Vienna and the European philosophical scene. From modest beginnings as a peripheral appendage to the department of contemporary history (where Stadler, originally a Mach scholar, had found an academic foothold), the IVC is now a university institute in philosophy and HPS. The patience and persistence to maintain a long view through years of petty academic trench warfare were required to overcome the institutional inertia that had blocked every previous attempt since 1945 to rehabilitate logical empiricism in its place of origin. Stadler and his associates, especially his co-editor Elisabeth Nemeth, are to be congratulated on their success in making Vienna, once again, hospitable to currents of thought that made it a world center of intellectual life in the 1920s and 30s.

A lot has changed since 1991, not only in Vienna. When Stadler began his crusade, logical empiricism was still in the philosophical doghouse, worldwide. "Most of us philosophy professors now look on logical positivism with some embarassment, as one looks back on one's own loutishness as a teenager," said Rorty (1998, p. 34). But now, as Richard Creath points out (17), even metaphysicians embrace Carnap. Certainly the trickle of publications on logical empiricism and its leading figures that began in the 1980s and early 90s has turned into quite a flood.

Stadler would be the first to admit that the IVC did not create this trend. In Austria itself, it was able to rely on the groundwork prepared by Rudolf Haller, whose recent death marks the end of an era. Haller's (1993) survey volume on "neopositivism" played approximately the role in Germany and Central Europe that Alberto Coffa's book did in the English-speaking world. It is impossible to imagine Stadler's own work, never mind that of his contemporaries around the world, without the pioneering efforts of Haller and Coffa. One immediately striking difference between Haller's work, though, and that represented in the present volumes is that Haller stressed the specific relevance and influence of an Austrian (i.e. Habsburg) philosophical tradition, which he was one of the first to identify and probe; indeed, Stadler himself began as a proponent of what Barry Smith called the "Neurath-Haller thesis," according to which the more cosmopolitan character of that "Austrian" philosophy, compared to the inward-looking idealisms prevalent in Germany, was due to the growing social consciousness and political activism of nineteenth-century Vienna. But while the "Viennese Heritage" remains present in these books' titles, it is now confined to the Vienna Circle itself. The Austrian emphasis has been displaced by a focus on European traditions in the philosophy of science. Cynics will point to the fact that Austria joined the EU in 1995, and that in a time of tight university budgets you have to follow the grant money; indeed these very books acknowledge in their front matter that their publication is subsidized by the European Science Foundation.

But can such considerations have moved the established and respected historian of inductive logic Maria Carla Galavotti to contribute a little survey on "Probabilistic Epistemology: A European Tradition" (17)? She briefly discusses an odd assortment of characters (Hosiasson, Ramsey, de Finetti, Jeffreys, and Reichenbach) without drawing connections among them; indeed she concedes that "the authors considered here embrace different notions of probability." In her own previous work on Jeffreys, she took for granted that the right context in which to discuss him was the English one to which he was primarily responding. Certainly she drew parallels between Jeffreys and de Finetti, but what does the new claim of a "European tradition" add to that? She suggests that Jeffreys and de Finetti (among others) shared "a cluster of ideas characterized by a pragmatist stance" (17, p. 88). Does this distinguish her "European" tradition from, say, an American one?

But there is a bit more to the obligatory "European" façade than such gestures; there is also a certain anxiety. Stadler's long introduction lists a great deal of activity, but admits in the end that it is "questionable" whether there is such a thing as "a genuine European philosophy of science today." However, he claims, there is "certainly a flourishing philosophy of science in Europe in a cosmopolitan context." (17, p. 31). For Gereon Wolters, in his little manifesto "Is There a European Philosophy of Science? A Wake-Up Call" (17), this "cosmopolitanism" is precisely the problem, as it essentially means subordination to the increasingly dominant Americans, whose provincialism, illustrated by some telling examples, he rightly deprecates. They compound their financial advantage (Harvard annually spends about 15 times as much per student as his own University of Konstanz, he calculates) by the simple expedient of speaking and writing English as a native language. Wolters recognizes that English is not going away as the international lingua franca, urges Europeans (especially the French and Germans) to get over it, and suggests they get their English up to speed instead of trying to resist. Anyway, he says, it is more their lack of ability to market themselves and get across what they have to say in accessible, plain words than their defective English that holds them back in the global academic marketplace.

He understands, of course, that this advice remains at the surface, and that more fundamental structural reform is needed to make European universities internationally competitive. He explicitly criticizes the "internal corruption, nepotism, and clientelism" of European university systems (17, p. 290), and understands the urgent need for change. He does not explicitly address the lopsided financial imbalance he points out, but it speaks for itself -- although the US is a little richer per capita than Europe, it is not 15 times richer! The tax laws and other aspects of university finance and bureaucracy are institutionally intertwined, and it is hard to see more money going into European higher education without fundamental change in the whole system. One hopes that Wolters and people as well-informed as he is about the abject disparities between American and European higher education will work toward changing the institutional sclerosis that has long prevented change.

Nonetheless, it is amazing what Europeans can still accomplish within these admittedly forbidding financial and institutional constraints. The Institute Vienna Circle is not the only success story; another is the establishment, generous financing, and recent enlargement of the Munich Center for Mathematical Philosophy under the leadership of Hannes Leitgeb and now Stefan Hartmann. At a stroke, this move has actually turned the tables on the Americans, at least as far as analytic philosophy is concerned. Logic and formal methods, though traditionally a core interest of analytic philosophy since Frege and Russell, has more and more been edged out of philosophy departments in the English-speaking world. The Munich Center is now probably the world's leading single institution in the cultivation of that particular core area of analytic philosophy. Moreover, Leitgeb and Hartmann have worked hard to expand that core, attracting the broadest possible spectrum of philosophers from all over the world as guests or visitors, thus exhibiting the depth and reach of formal methods across different areas of philosophy, different questions, different traditions and styles. This "big tent" approach has established the Munich center almost overnight -- it was founded less than five years ago -- as a serious player in the global dialogue of analytic philosophy.

The success of the Munich approach suggests that Wolters's emphasis on form (communication skills and resources) is not the whole answer. Munich suggests that putting substance front and center may be more effective: European philosophy of science is taken seriously when it actually has something to contribute -- especially when that something still has a widespread constituency in Anglo-America but has been sharply resource-constrained there by short-sighted departments and administrators.

In any case, the real substance of these volumes is what they continue to do behind the European façade, which is just what the Institute Vienna Circle Yearbooks have always been best at -- offering a range of interesting, sometimes even offbeat or eccentric, scholarship on logical empiricism and the Vienna Circle in particular.

The primarily historical papers reflect the noticeable uptick in the attention devoted to Moritz Schlick in recent years. In addition to a far-advanced scholarly edition of Schlick's works, two entire series of publications have been launched to support this new focus of research, the Schlickiana in Berlin, since 2008, and its Viennese Parallelaktion, the Schlick-Studien launched in 2009; but these are only the tip of a rather large iceberg, which we can be grateful to the volumes under review for bringing to international attention. Massimo Ferarri's overview of recent writings on Schlick (17) is extremely valuable, as it brings to the attention of English-speakers, with intelligent commentary, a wide sampling of what has been going on in this new Schlick literature, which is mostly in German. While it is perhaps too often left to the reader to find connections between this research and the existing English-language Schlick literature, current and future scholars of Schlick and the Vienna Circle will have to give it their attention.

One of the rising stars of this literature is Thomas Neuber, whose book on the dialogue between Schlick and Cassirer about the foundations of geometry is discussed in some detail by Ferrari (who as a Cassirer biographer naturally finds that Neuber does insufficient justice to Cassirer's sophisticated conception of an historically relativized a priori). Neuber's own survey here (17), in English, of realistic tendencies within logical empiricism is too brief, unfortuantely, to do justice to the viewpoint he has been developing, and leaves many questions open. Interestingly, he finds that even the quasi-realism advanced by Schlick in the protocol-sentence debate is strongly tinged with a linguistic conventionalism, though he says too little here to establish this (his book elaborates). In contrast to e.g. Putnam (2001), he says the same about the Reichenbach of Experience and Nature, though without further evidence he would appear to be overstating the degree to which Reichenbach makes "scientific realism dependent on pragmatist presuppositions" (17, p. 255). His hero is none of the above, nor Feigl, but Eino Kaila, who unlike them "rejects the linguistic turn," and embraces a more full-bodied metaphysical realism. Again, too little is said here to know whether he means the Fregean linguistic turn of which Dummett made such a point or the later Carnapian one of 1932 (the principle of tolerance). And it is unclear whether in embracing Kaila, Neuber means to regard him as a precursor to Quine's rejection of the Carnapian linguistic turn, or, say, of the present-day efforts by Timothy Williamson and others to "undo the linguistic turn" and get back to "taking philosophical problems at face value." Still, for all its tantalizing brevity, it is good to have Neuber's piece as a trailer for his extensive work in German, and perhaps he will soon give us more details.

Hans-Jürgen Wendel's well-documented and valuable historical reconstruction of Schlick's early epistemological development (18) focuses on Schlick's critique of American pragmatism and his dialogue with Reichenbach, unearthing many details of the context, and connecting them with specific revisions to the the first edition of Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre. Since his focus is mostly on Schlick, however, he stops short of addressing the question about the Reichenbach-Schlick correspondence Michael Friedman has given wide currency to -- the question why Reichenbach, within a year or two of the correspondence Wendel discusses, agrees with Schlick that their disagreement has been merely terminological (should the underlying principles be called [relativized] synthetic a priori statements or, following Poincaré, conventions?) and acquiesces in Schlick's preferred usage of "conventions." Friedman (1994) of course argued that the disagreement had not been merely terminological, which actually gets some support from passages Wendel cites; certainly in 1920, at the time of the correspondence, Reichenbach advanced good arguments both for regarding the inherent (i.e. logical) restrictions on combinations among principles as having an "Erkenntnisgehalt" and for a different understanding of Poincaré (18, p. 56). It is to be hoped that Wendel will bring his impressive scholarship to bear on these questions, and help clarify the degree to which the disagreement about the interpretation of Poincaré was actually an underlying philosophical difference that would later be glossed over.

Björn Henning, in an equally learned and well-documented historical reconstruction of Schlick's conception of psychology and the mental (18), convincingly places Schlick's conception of the psychophysical parallelism in the context of other philosophers and psychologists of the early twentieth century. Against this background Henning is able to tell a coherent and well-motivated story of the relevant changes from the first to the second edition of the Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre. It would have been interesting, though, if rather than restricting his focus quite so tightly, he had brought these insights to bear on Schlick's apparent claim, in the notes to his edition of Helmholtz's papers with Paul Hertz in 1921, that the general perspective of the Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre was consistent with, and had indeed been inspired by, Helmholtz's Zeichentheorie. Michael Friedman (1997, pp. 41ff.) concludes that Schlick had evidently not noticed the contradiction between his own more realistic conception and the less ontological one of Helmholtz, but it would be very interesting to revisit this question against the background of Henning's directly relevant scholarship.

But there is more than just Schlick in these volumes. It is of course impossible to discuss every paper in the vast assortment of historical and more systematic papers they contain, touching on such a wide spectrum of issues. Dagfinn Føllesdal's detailed examination of Gödel's attraction to Husserl's phenomenology (17), in the context of his later efforts to articulate his views about mental access to mathematical objects, gives a clear and plausible account of Gödel's approach to Husserl. And indeed Føllesdal lavishes high praise on Gödel's platonist interpretation of Husserl, comparing it favorably to others. If Føllesdal's view is right, though, and Husserl did supply the missing philosophical ingredient Gödel had implicitly been searching for during the years before 1959, one wonders why Gödel did not go back and re-work e.g. his Gibbs lecture or his critique of Carnap, on whose successive drafts he had spent a great deal of time and effort over the previous six years (and which he had not given up the idea of publishing sometime), in the light of the new insights afforded by phenomenology. Føllesdal attributes Gödel's unwillingness to publish his later philosophical papers merely to over-scrupulousness. But perhaps Gödel, while certainly finding inspiration in phenomenology, also realized that it was not quite the definitive solution to his philosophical questions that Føllesdal portrays it as.

John Norton's paper about statistical physics (17) covers a great deal of ground in a brief space. Norton argues that the widespread mutual incomprehension in the discussion of reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics is due to a failure to distinguish two different levels: (a) the transition from the few to the many component level within molecular analysis and (b) the transition from molecular analysis to thermodynamics. The failure of reduction discussed by some authors, he says, arises in (a) and not (b). Such examples should serve as an antidote to the still widespread use of "reductionism" and "unity of science" in very sweeping, general terms as if such concepts had inherent meanings in isolation from their application in specific contexts. Jan Faye's paper (17) sounds superficially like an example of this, but is actually a misleadingly brief summary of his book, which is explained more satisfactorily in Thomas Uebel's review (17).

Uebel also contributes a paper (17) on a question that, as far as I am aware, is almost entirely unexplored: to what extent was Carnap's later philosophical deflationism due to his own leanings toward positions not reconcilable with other ideas (such as physicalism) that he otherwise preferred? Uebel uses an example that he himself has explored from many perspectives in previous work, the intertranslatability of the physical and autopsychological bases in the Aufbau, but here pushes it in a new and somewhat unexpected direction. This paper is a good example of the usefulness of the IVC yearbook in the global dialogue; it not only gives a forum for younger scholars (especially from Eastern Europe), but also makes it possible for established figures like Uebel to give a somewhat speculative angle to their previous research in an open-ended way that they probably would not have got into a journal or published in some more constrained venue.

Another example of this is Richard Creath's paper on the continued relevance of Carnap's anti-metaphysical stance during the Vienna years (17). Creath notes the recent efflorescence of metaphysics among analytical philosophers, and claims that it is largely innocent of the sins Carnap detected in the bad old metaphysics he was critical of in Vienna. The kind of metaphysics we must still view with Carnapian skepticism, Creath says, is to be found these days less in philosophy than in the larger discourse environments of politics and journalism. Others are less optimistic than Creath about the innocence of analytic metaphysics, and tend rather to share Huw Price's (2009) appraisal of Carnap's likely response had he been frozen in the 1950s and recently brought to life again -- he would have wondered whether he had written in vain. But actually, Creath might not disagree; he also says that Carnap's anti-metaphysical view is still relevant because we all, philosophers included, are apt to sound like metaphysicians when we take our disputes to be over matters of fact; we forget the principle of tolerance, and forget the relativity of our arguments to the language they are framed in.

Stadler and the IVC are to be congratulated on maintaining such a forum in which many voices can contend. Like the Munich center, the IVC is a welcome sign that philosophy of science, and specifically interest in logical empiricism, are alive and well in Europe; may they continue to thrive, and may the IVC continue for another twenty years!


Friedman, M. (1994) "Geometry, Convention, and the Relativized A Priori" Repr. in his Reconsidering Logical Positivism (Cambridge 1999).

Friedman, M. (1997) "Helmholtz's Zeichentheorie and Schlick's Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre: Early Logical Empiricism and its Nineteenth-Century Background" Repr. in his Reconsidering Logical Positivism (Cambridge 1999).

Haller, R. (1993) Neopositivismus: Eine historische Einführung in die Philosophie des Wiener Kreises (Darmstadt).

Price, H. (2009) "Metaphysics after Carnap: The Ghost Who Walks?" in D. Chalmers, D. Manley, and R. Wasserman, eds. Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology (Oxford).

Putnam, H. (2001) "Hans Reichenbach: Realist and Verificationist" in J. Floyd and S. Shieh, eds. Future Pasts: The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy (Oxford).

Rorty, R. (1998) "Against Unity" Wilson Quarterly.