Evaluative Perception

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Anna Bergqvist and Robert Cowan (eds.), Evaluative Perception, Oxford University Press, 2018, 333pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198786054.

Reviewed by Jennifer Matey, Southern Methodist University


Can we perceive a dancer's movement as graceful? Can the felt sense of discomfort at a perceived act of sadism provide immediate justification for a moral belief about the wrongness of the act? The fourteen essays collected in Anna Bergqvist and Robert Cowan's edited volume address these and other issues surrounding evaluative perception. Evaluative perception is the perception of things as having moral, aesthetic, or prudential values. It is an issue that intersects with recent debates over the possibility of 'high-level' perception, the perception of objects as having properties that are not reducible to color, shape, or spatial properties. On the one hand, it is reasonable to treat evaluative perception as a type of high-level perception, since values are not identical to sensible features -- they are 'high-level', so to speak. But determining whether evaluative properties are perceived requires that we look beyond the standard arguments for high-level properties, since evaluative properties bring along a unique set of worries. For instance, while it may seem clear that the high-level kind property of being a Redwood tree is a property that a tree can really have, the ontological status of value properties is perhaps less clear. Moreover, some claim that the detection of evaluative properties is accomplished via emotions or intuitions; would this then preclude or even entail their being perceptual?

Bergqvist and Cowan provide an illuminating introduction in which they address various complexities that occupy discussions about evaluative perception. For instance, they distinguish three types of evaluative perception, each corresponding to a different modality of representation. Whereas cannonical value perception would involve just sensory perception, affective value perception is a type of emotional perception of value. A final view is that value is represented in sui generis or novel and irreducible psychological states. Bergqvist and Cowan also lay out the phenomenological and epistemological motivations for evaluative perception. Whereas epistemological arguments claim that evaluative perception is needed to ground moral knowledge, phenomenological arguments appeal to felt differences between non-doxastic experiences that do and that don't evaluate their objects.

The essays are grouped according to three themes. The first section concerns the existence and nature of evaluative perception. It oversimplifies to attempt a tidy division of views into for and against camps, since the presuppositions one starts with about how perception is to be individuated from other psychological states will play a role in how one comes down on the issue. For example, if one holds a strictly modular and canonical view of perception, then they may deny evaluative perception. And those who favor functional-role models may include emotional experiences that detect value as sufficiently perception-like. The result is that some asserted disagreements may appear more terminological than substantive without a thorough defense of these underlying presuppositions.

The first two papers, by Dustin Stokes and Heather Logue, focus on the possible perception of aesthetic properties. In "Rich Perceptual Content and Aesthetic Properties", Stokes presents a challenge for the modularity based view that perception only represents low-level properties, effectively shifting the burden of proof onto the skeptic. He uses the phenomenal contrast between different ways of seeing ambiguous figures to show that we experience perceptual gestalts. Low-level theories cannot explain the differences in ways of seeing ambiguous figures; they must either deny the experiential difference or appeal to a controversial view that such felt differences are cognitive. Seeing things as having aesthetic properties such as 'impressionist', according to Stokes, is likewise based on organizational gestalts. The essay concludes with the introduction of three possible mechanisms for aesthetic perception.

In "Can We Visually Experience Aesthetic Properties?", Logue takes the stance that, just as with other high-level properties, there may be no fact of the matter over whether there is visual perception of aesthetic properties. She argues that phenomenological contrasts between experiences that do and experiences that don't seem to represent properties like 'gracefulness', can be wholly explained by emotional phenomenology. Nor are the epistemic arguments for the visual perception of aesthetic properties conclusive. After reviewing the standard arguments against high-level properties, as well as a number of novel arguments both for and against the perception of aesthetic properties, she speculates that the matter may be indeterminate.

Robert Audi's "Moral Perception Defended" defends the reality and perceptibility of moral phenomena and argues that perception of moral features can ground moral knowledge. Although moral properties are not observable in the way that sensible properties such as shape are, they can be perceived by way of phenomenal states that integrate sensations along with emotions and other 'seemings'. For example, when we see moral wrongdoing, we may experience a sense of unfittingness at what is visually detected. The sense of unfittingness, moreover, is felt to be integrated with the sensory properties that it is based on. According to Audi, these integrated experiences are perceptual in the sense that they dispose one to attribute the moral property in a way that is epistemically direct.

"Evaluative Perception as Response-Dependent Representation", by Paul Noordhof, presents a view about the rich, non-sensory evaluative content of perceptual experience that can accommodate two concerns that arise for evaluative perception. First, some cases of evaluative perception lack phenomenal presence. Second, evaluative properties exist by virtue of their non-evaluative bases, but the bases can be quite diverse, so the unity of these bases under a single concept requires some explanation. Noordhof contends that both features can be explained by the view that evaluative perception involves intrinsic response dependent representation.

In "Doubts About Moral Perception", Pekka Väyrynen undermines the phenomenological motivation for moral perception by offering a simpler, more unified account. Although evaluative moral properties may be contents of representational states that have perceptual representations as parts, what may seem like perceptual representations are actually the result of habitual, implicit, non-inferential transitions in thought. In addition to being more easily accounted for otherwise, Väyrynen argues that there are no explanatory or epistemological benefits to the view that moral properties are perceptually represented. While moral properties may seem integrated with perceptual experiences, they can make both an epistemic and phenomenological difference without being represented perceptually.

The two concluding essays in the section both discuss the perception of absence. Mikael Pettersson's "Seeing Depicted Space (Or Not)" focuses on the pictorial representation of empty space in pictures. Pettersson argues that to experience empty space in pictures is to be aware of that space as a potential location for visible objects. The awareness of space as a potential place for things comes from the employment of imagination, and the penetration of the visual experience by the imaginative representation of what is not there.

Anya Farennikova's "Perception of Absence as Value-Driven Perception" argues that evaluative perceptual experiences represent absences. She uses the example of the detected absence of a wedding ring on a finger. Such a detected absence is perceptual in the sense that it relies on a process used in ordinary perception-perceptual template matching. On Farennikova's model, mental templates of what we expect to find perceptually are produced and this aids in visual search and recognition generally. In the case of absence, desires and expectations, which express the significance of the sought-for object for the perceiver, drive this process and provide the content both for what is and isn't seen.

The next four papers focus more directly on the epistemological facets of evaluative perception. Sarah McGrath's "Moral Perception and Its Rivals, favors the view that we can have perceptual knowledge of moral properties. This has important implications for ethical theory because it entails that not all moral knowledge is of moral principles; some moral knowledge consists in singular judgments about cases. McGrath's defense of moral perception is largely an argument by elimination. The most likely alternative view is that moral knowledge is inferential. She critiques three different types of inferential models: deductive, inductive, and Kieran Setiya's reductive epistemology. McGrath finds these models to be either psychologically implausible, question begging, or to have highly unintuitive implications. The perceptual model, on the other hand, escapes these problems and, she argues, fits the phenomenology.

In "Perception and Intuition of Evaluative Properties", Jack C. Lyons denies that perceptual experiences with rich modality-specific sensory phenomenology represent evaluative properties. He instead favors the view that we have phenomenologically bland but perception-like intuitions of evaluative properties. These intuitions have the same epistemic status as perception, however. They justify evaluative beliefs because the process that yields them is reliable, just as perception is. That process, according to Lyons, is also modular in the way that ordinary perception is; importantly, it is opaque and resistant to beliefs of the larger organism.

In "On the Epistemological Significance of Value Perception", Michael Milona takes a critical stance toward high-level theories of perception such as Audi's, which endorse the view that high-level evaluative properties are represented in perceptual states that integrate the evaluative contents of evaluative-seeming states with the low-level sensory contents that they are prompted by. Although Milona agrees that evaluative seemings are real, he argues that we have no epistemological motivation to suppose evaluative seemings are ever integrated in perceptual experience. The argument is made based on consideration of the role of imagination in acquiring evaluative knowledge. Since we have evaluative intuitions or seemings in response to imagined scenarios independent of the five senses, and those seemings can be sources of immediate justification, we should be led to wonder whether the perceptual theory's presumption that such seemings are integrated with sensory experience is at all motivated. Milona thinks they are more likely explanatorily inert. He concludes with the suggestion that the affective model, which takes emotions to represent evaluative properties, is likely to be more epistemically significant.

Sentimentalists take emotions to be perception-like states that convey evaluative information about intentional objects. This information is taken by the sentimentalist as an immediate source of justification for evaluative beliefs. One objection to sentimentalism is that, unlike other basic evidential sources such as perceptual experiences, emotions are reasons-responsive; emotions can be held for reasons and so themselves are justified. This seems to entail that emotions, unlike perceptual experiences, cannot be foundational. In "Epistemic Sentimentalism and Epistemic Reason-Responsiveness", Robert Cowan argues that the fact that emotions are epistemically dependent does not entail that they can't be generative sources of justification. He argues that although they are epistemically dependent, emotions may be ontologically emergent sources of justification for evaluative propositions.

The final section includes essays that focus on the connection between evaluative perception and value theory. Graham Oddie's "Value Perception, Properties, and the Primary Bearers of Value" provides a compelling solution to the isomorphism problem for value perception. According to Oddie, desires and emotions provide well functioning perceivers with information about the value of their intentional objects. But an apparent conflict arises for this view, since although two things might be recognized to be equally valuable or disvaluable, we don't always manifest isomorphic feelings toward them; the pain of my loved one may be more undesirable than the pain of a stranger, though on reflection I may acknowledge each to be equally bad. Moreover, well-adjusted people often desire very different things. Oddie argues that if we understand the primary bearers of value to be states of being, many of these perspectival effects of value appearances can be accommodated.

In "Moral Perception, Thick Concepts, and Perspectivalism", Bergqvist relies on Iris Murdoch's view that concepts operative in worldviews frame how the world is apprehended and facilitate the perception of value by making manifest a world of value for us. To limit what might be conceived as value for us, Bergqvist suggests, we should appeal to action-oriented perception and action-guiding thick moral concepts.

James Lenman's "The Primacy of the Passions" presents an account of desire as a kind of affective perception of value. Our desires, which according to Lenman provide the basis for our reasons for acting, exist as a part of a coherent web of considered attitudes. Reflecting on the nature of desire provides insight into what one takes to have value, though it seems that Lenman takes it that these values are experienced as being objective rather than perspectival.

Kathleen Stock's "Sexual Objectification, Objectifying Images, and 'Mind-Insensitive Seeing-As'" provides a causal explanation for objectifying behavior in terms of cultural images and products that she claims promote a kind of 'mind-insensitive' perception of others. She describes a number of ways that images encourage the perception of women (and others) as devoid of minds or distinct personalities. For example, images may present people as reducible to body parts or identify persons with animals. Stock shows that there is some empirical support for the view that, as one becomes habituated to seeing persons as mere bodies, for example through objectifying images, they may begin to de-emphasize the mental life of others around them more generally.

This book is a valuable resource for philosophers who are interested in getting a better grasp on the various issues at stake in discussions about the perception of value properties. In my estimation, the most compelling issues in this arena concern the emotional representation of evaluative properties, the need to resolve the view that value is an objective matter with the subject's perspectival representation of value, and the set of issues that come up around the integration of evaluative contents with more ordinary modality-specific perceptual experiences or sensory perception. With respect to this last issue, one particularly interesting area of investigation concerns the phenomenological impact of integration. Several of the papers endorse the view that evaluative intuitions, emotions, or some other form of 'seemings' lend their contents to and thereby add to the phenomenological character of the larger integrative states. But the specific phenomenological contributions themselves, including their variety, deserve to be thoroughly investigated. The absence of this project from this volume is not a shortcoming; rather, the book sets the stage for projects like this, and for other areas of future research.