Event and Time

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Claude Romano, Event and Time, Stephen E. Lewis (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2014, 269pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823255344.

Reviewed by Andrea Staiti, Boston College


Claude Romano is one of the leading figures in contemporary French phenomenology. He has published extensively on the subject, and his work has recently drawn the attention of Anglophone scholars. Event and Time is the second part of a two-volume project, which was originally published in French in 1998 and 1999. The first part is called Event and World, and it came out in English translation (also at Fordham University Press) in 2009. Given the centrality of the notion of event in French phenomenology, Romano's work is a must-read for everyone interested in the topic. To date there simply is no other philosophical study of the event as thorough and ambitious as Romano's. Before addressing the content of the book it is perhaps appropriate to mention that although there are some clumsy moments -- mainly due to the inherent impossibility of rendering Romano's complex French turns of phrase into English -- the translation is overall readable and clear. Moreover, while it would be advisable to read Event and World first, Romano does a good job of rehearsing some of the key insights from his first book so that Event and Time can be read independently.

In Part One Romano takes his bearing from a critical examination of what he labels "the metaphysics of time" (9), which, he argues, "unfolds, historically, within a unitary horizon" (9). The metaphysics of time has failed to grasp the essence of time in that "time has been conceived as being in time" (10), that is, time has been interpreted from the perspective of inner-temporal phenomena such as linear movement or change. The governing metaphors for the understanding of time in Western thought (such as flow, stream, passage) betray a fundamental difficulty in grasping time as such and a tendency to think about time "on the basis of the phenomenal features of what is in time" (14). For Romano this tendency is common to both objective and subjective theories of time, in that both the movement of things in the world and the inner flow of consciousness are processes happening in time. They are not time itself.

In spite of the dominant trend of the metaphysics of time, Romano argues that in this tradition there are also gestures pointing in a different direction, namely, gestures that hint at the possibility of grasping the event as the origin of time. This is the perspective from which Romano sets out to interpret the work of three giants of metaphysics: Plato, Aristotle, and Augustine (18-93). Particularly intriguing is Romano's choice of developing his interpretation of Plato's theory of time focusing exclusively on the Parmenides, rather than turning to the locus classicus where Plato addresses time, namely, the Timaeus. After exposing the paradoxes and contradictions of viewing time as oriented change, Plato introduces the notion of "the sudden" (tò exaíphnes) as "freed from every condition of anteriority and posteriority, ab-solute in its arising, in no way subordinated to a prior temporal horizon; in its bursting forth from and in itself, it brings with itself its own horizon" (37). Plato's notion of the sudden is thus a gesture toward the notion of event Romano develops in subsequent chapters.

Aristotle, on the contrary, dismisses Plato's conception of the sudden and replaces it with a "calm continuity" (59) in which the past has primacy over the present, in that it is only as past that the present presents itself. Thus, Aristotle "opens the way to a conception of time that sees time as such in the horizon of inner-temporality" (65) and even to the subsequent "subjectivization of time" (66), which Romano sees carried out by Augustine. In Book Eleven of Confessions Augustine famously claims that time is distentio animi. However, Romano notices a difficulty in Augustine's inclusion of temporal adverbs "in order to describe the temporalizing activity of the soul" (91). This is evidence that it is impossible to equate the movements of consciousness with time, and that time has to be understood as something outside the soul, or something in which the soul itself stands (93).

This first part of the book is insightful in many ways; however, it would have been much more enjoyable had it been more carefully organized and edited. For example, the sections on Plato and Aristotle consist of some fifty extremely dense pages of continuous writing. No concession is made to the reader. No aid is offered to help stay focused and make sure the reader does not lose the thread. Titled subsections like the ones included in the chapter on Augustine (67-97) are much needed for the foregoing chapters, too. Incidentally, while Romano's reading of Augustine as carrying out a subjectivization of time is plausible (but by no means uncontroversial), one is left wondering if a lengthy section of more than twenty-five pages was absolutely necessary to rehearse a thesis that is certainly not new.

Parts Two and Three are the strongest and most engaging parts of Event and Time. In them Romano turns to address the work of classical phenomenologists in order then to present his own original view, thereby expanding on the notion of event as the origin of time. Romano finds that both Husserl and Heidegger fundamentally remained trapped in a subjective understanding of time (98-109). Considering the abundance of literature on both figures, and considering the amount of scholarly work accomplished, for instance, to clarify the complexities of Husserl's phenomenology of time, it is somewhat disappointing that Romano discusses their views only cursorily.

However, this is understandable in light of his desire to introduce his own hypothesis on the nature of time, which is less a dismissal of subjectivity than an attempt to rethink the status of subjectivity in light of an event-centered understanding of time. Romano introduces the neologism "advenant" (which he already employed in Event and World) to designate "man apprehended outside the subject, in the light of his event-advent to, and as himself starting from, what happens [advient] to him" (109). In the context of this redefinition of the guiding thread for an inquiry into the nature of time, we find the first (and most explicit) definition of event, which is worth quoting in full:

An event is that which, by modifying some possibilities of the world, always strikes, at the same time, the world as a whole, that is to say, reconfigures the possible in totality. With the event, "all is changed": what is modified is the very countenance of the world, that which the world, so to speak, turns toward me when I consider it in its possibilities. (111)

For the rest of the book the event as defined above is now taken as the guiding thread, and temporality is interpreted as engendered by the very "bursting forth" (129) of the event. Despite being absolute newness the event is also always "older than itself" (133) and "in suspense" (135) because it is recognized as such in retrospect and it includes a hazy aura of future. This three-dimensionality of the event has far-reaching consequences for the self-understanding of the advenant, too. Romano introduces the word "vistas" (154) to address the three dimensions of experience (past, present, and future) introduced in the advenant by the self-temporalization of the event. As the helpful recapitulation of this section emphasizes, these three vistas "constitute dimensions at once heterogeneous and co-originary in their differential arising, the absolute diachrony of which is irreducible both at once to every inner-temporal present and to the temporalizing presence of a subject" (207).

In the final section Romano addresses the finitude of temporality and thereby a number of difficult questions concerning, for example, how events can inaugurate different histories and how out of a multiplicity of histories something like the unity of a history can come about (227-235). To conclude, he raises a question that an attentive reader may have raised much earlier:

How, indeed, can we reconcile the plurality of events (and of the histories to which they give rise), each of which opens -- and shuts -- a world, with the uniqueness of the world for every advenant? How can these "plural" worlds coexist, if my histories are not necessarily "successive", but if certain among them are "simultaneous"? How can the advenant relate at once to several worlds?  . . . There is one single world in which every adventure takes place, from birth to death. (236)

Romano adamantly points out that if it has to be one and the same world that takes on different countenances and whose overall meaning becomes reconfigured in the wake of events, then

It is not enough . . . that the meaning of the world be dependent, in each case, on events; it is necessary that the world have a meaning, be coherent; there must be, if we can put it this way, a meaning of meaning, and this meaning cannot proceed, in its turn, from the event alone. (237)

Romano confesses: "Here we reach the extreme limits of my project, and probably the limits -- strictly defined -- of every hermeneutical phenomenology" (239).

Perhaps this conclusion is one of the major achievements of Romano's book. After journeying competently through the complexities of the notion of event as it has been introduced in French hermeneutical phenomenology, he hit upon the event's intrinsic inability to account for the overarching, all-encompassing field in which events take place: the world. The fact that this realization is the limit of hermeneutical phenomenology, however, does not mean that it is the limit of phenomenology tout court. It certainly is not the limit of transcendental phenomenology as envisioned and carried out by Husserl, especially in the last decades of his life. Genetic phenomenology, in particular, has done a great deal to clarify how the intricate play of syntheses in (transcendental) consciousness make it possible for something like a world, that is, one intersubjectively shared world to come about. In the end, maybe Romano's Event and Time is a masterful example of how post-Husserlian phenomenologists' attempts to break free from transcendental constitution, if carried out consistently, ultimately lead to a dead end. While this may be a somewhat disappointing conclusion to reach after reading through over two-hundred and fifty pages of dense philosophical prose, the lucidity of Romano's exploration of the notion of event and the intellectual honesty displayed in his concluding remarks are thoroughly admirable.