Every Thing Must Go: Metaphysics Naturalized

Placeholder book cover

James Ladyman and Don Ross, with David Spurrett and John Collier, Every Thing Must Go: Metaphysics Naturalized, Oxford UP, 2007, 346pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199573097.

Reviewed by Cian Dorr, Oxford University



Ladyman, Ross and their collaborators (Spurrett is a co-author of two chapters, Collier of one) begin their book with a ferocious attack on “analytic metaphysics”, as it is currently practiced. Their opening blast claims that contemporary analytic metaphysics ‘contributes nothing to human knowledge’: its practitioners are ‘wasting their talents’, and the whole enterprise, although ‘engaged in by some extremely intelligent and morally serious people, fails to qualify as part of the enlightened pursuit of objective truth, and should be discontinued’ (vii). They set out on a ‘mission of disciplinary rescue’ in the spirit of Hume and the logical positivists, in which a fair proportion of philosophy as currently practiced — as they realize, their critique applies far beyond the boundaries of metaphysics proper — will be consigned to the flames.

Unlike Hume and the positivists, the authors don’t seem especially worried about the intelligibility of the questions discussed by analytic metaphysicians. What’s got them so riled up is the way analytic metaphysicians go about arguing about these questions. As the authors see it, analytic metaphysics systematically refuses to pay attention to the considerations that are really relevant to answering the questions, while assigning great weight to considerations that are entirely irrelevant. Let us consider these alleged defects in turn.

What analytic metaphysicians don’t do and should be doing, according to the authors, is informing themselves, in a serious, sustained way, of the results of any modern science beyond “A-level chemistry”. The general view is that such engagement is unnecessary, on the grounds that the scientific details have no clear bearing on the questions the metaphysicians care about. The authors think this is a mistake, since science in general and modern physics in particular have given us grounds for rejecting many claims that analytic metaphysicians widely take for granted. In chapter 1 (which is where the attack on analytic metaphysics takes place), this claim is substantiated mainly with bald and sweeping assertions — e.g., that physics has shown that most physical objects are not spatially located (18), or that spacetime points are ‘pseudo-scientific’ and unknown to science (14), or that the claim that everything is composed of atoms (in the metaphysicians’ sense of objects lacking proper parts) ‘has no more in common with reality as physics describes it than does the ancient cosmology of four elements and perfect celestial spheres’ (20). (In later chapters, the tone becomes markedly more tentative and exploratory, and there is more acknowledgement of the difficulty of extracting metaphysical claims from physics. I will discuss the claims defended in these chapters in section 2 below.) The authors don’t devote much effort to figuring out which of the presuppositions they identify actually play a crucial role in the theories in which they figure, and which of them are merely dispensable pretences adopted for the sake of concreteness and vividness.1

There is certainly a fair amount of truth in this part of the authors’ critique. But however widespread the presuppositions might be, and however strong the scientific case against them, this sort of critique clearly cannot vindicate the claim that analytic metaphysics ‘contributes nothing to human knowledge’. Past scientists have made great contributions to human knowledge despite making many false presuppositions which they were in no position to separate from their genuine contributions. Analytic metaphysicians with false beliefs about physics might be in the same position; the authors offer no account of the role the rejected presuppositions play that could suggest otherwise. The heart of the authors’ case thus rests on their objection to the way analytic metaphysicians do argue — namely, their view that unjustified appeals to intuition play a central role in the methodology of analytic metaphysics.

The concern is as old as philosophy itself. Look at any well-written paper in analytic philosophy and you will see arguments aplenty; if the author has not done your work for you by making a list of numbered premises, he or she has probably done enough that you could make such a list without having to exercise too much creativity. The arguments may very well be valid: you will be convinced that the conclusions are true if the premises are. So far, so good, you think. Now, what about the premises — the claims that are not the conclusions of any argument? Where did they come from? (The premise factory?) You will look again to see what your author has to say in favour of them. Sometimes you will find an appeal to some expert authority. But pretty often — perhaps especially often in metaphysics — you will find your author saying something to the effect that the premise is intuitive, or “supported by intuition”, or that its negation is “counterintuitive”. After considering an assortment of examples of analytic metaphysicians saying this sort of thing, the authors conclude that something has gone dreadfully wrong with the whole discipline: ‘the criteria of adequacy for metaphysical systems have clearly come apart from anything to do with the truth’ (13). As they repeatedly emphasize, the questions of metaphysics are not psychological or sociological questions; they are about the world. And what reason is there to think that our intuitions about these questions tend to be correct, given that ‘proficiency in inferring the large-scale and small-scale structure of our immediate environment, or any features of parts of the universe distant from our ancestral stomping grounds, was of no relevance to our ancestors’ reproductive fitness’ (2)?

It is an understandable worry, and one that metaphysicians have invited in their attempts to reflect on their own methodology. These reflections make it look like ‘appeals to intuition’ are part of a distinctive method for doing metaphysics, a method we could contemplate giving up in its entirety, as the authors indeed advocate: ‘as naturalists, we are not concerned with preserving intuitions at all’ (12). But very often, ‘intuition’ talk is playing no such distinctive role. Often, saying ‘Intuitively, P’ is no more than a device for committing oneself to P while signaling that one is not going to provide any further arguments for this claim. In this use, ‘intuitively … ’ is more or less interchangeable with ’it seems to me that … ’. There is a pure and chilly way of writing philosophy in which premises and conclusions are baldly asserted. But it’s hard to write like this without seeming to bully one’s readers; one can make things a bit gentler and more human by occasionally inserting qualifiers like ‘it seems that’. It would be absurd to accuse someone who frequently gave in to this stylistic temptation of following a bankrupt methodology that presupposes the erroneous claim that things generally are as they seem. But the sprinkling of ‘intuitively’s and ‘counterintuitive’s around a typical paper in metaphysics is in most cases not significantly different from this. It may be bad style, but it is not bad methodology, or any methodology at all, unless arguing from premises to conclusions counts as a methodology.

(Sometimes things get a little more involved: we find claims like ‘intuition supports P more strongly than it supports Q’, or even more elaborate claims about the relative importance of fidelity to intuition as against other considerations. But even in these cases, I doubt anything of cognitive significance would be lost if everything were written without reference to intuitions, e.g., by replacing ‘intuition supports P more strongly than it supports Q’ with a bald assertion of ‘if either P or Q, then P’.)

Of course the authors are not objecting to the practice of giving arguments that rely on premises. Their view, of course, is that metaphysicians often give arguments with bad premises — mere prejudices, which they have no good reason to believe. But is this even controversial? Disagreement in metaphysics is notoriously pervasive and deeply-rooted: I suppose most metaphysicians will agree that their opponents often rely on such unjustified premises, at least once it is made clear that this is compatible with their being ‘extremely intelligent and morally serious’. The claim that metaphysicians should stop arguing from unjustified premises is no basis for a ‘mission of disciplinary rescue’. And while the claim that they should spend more time investigating the potential bearing of modern science on the questions they discuss is hard to take exception with, it does not answer to the authors’ aspirations. They are looking for some much sharper criterion of methodological soundness - some descendent of Hume’s Fork upon which they can impale the unworthy products of analytic metaphysics before pitching them onto the bonfire.

After trying out a few formulations, the criterion they end up with is the following ‘Principle of Naturalistic Closure’ (PNC):

Any new metaphysical claim that is to be taken seriously at time t should be motivated by, and only by, the service it would perform, if true, in showing how two or more specific scientific hypotheses, at least one of which is drawn from fundamental physics, jointly explain more than the sum of what is explained by the two hypotheses taken separately. (30)2

In context it is clear that believing a metaphysical claim involves “taking it seriously” in the relevant sense. So according to the PNC, if I try to “motivate” some new metaphysical claim with an argument that does not show or suggest, of any two specific scientific hypotheses, that they explain more together than separately, I will be wasting my time; enlightened metaphysicians ought not to be convinced.

What is puzzling about this is that it instructs us to ignore a very large class of arguments without telling us anything at all about where they fail. Consider a simple metaphysical argument that refers to no scientific hypotheses: ‘the statue on my desk was made this morning; the lump of clay on my desk has existed for a long time; so the statue on my desk is distinct from the lump of clay on my desk; so distinct material objects sometimes spatially coincide’. Or an argument that appeals to only one scientific hypothesis: ‘If presentism is true, simultaneity is absolute; but simultaneity is not absolute; so presentism is not true’. The PNC seems to say that these arguments are no good: they are the wrong kind of arguments to “motivate” belief in their conclusions. But how can that be? What are we supposed to do, if we initially believed the premises, and have just noticed that they entail the conclusion? Are we rationally required to stop believing at least one of the premises, so that we don’t violate the PNC by coming to believe the conclusion? This seems absurd. Perhaps the authors’ opposition to “intuitions” extends to advocating agnosticism about when statues and lumps of clay are created, though we might note that when we are dealing with such mundane matters, the evolutionary objection to the reliability of intuitions has little force. But if their methodological dictum is ruling out even paradigms of fruitful interplay between physics and metaphysics as the relativistic objection to presentism, clearly something has gone very wrong.

What has happened, I think, is this: the authors’ selfproclaimedly “”SpellE">scientistic" view of the supremacy of the sciences among forms of human inquiry makes it prima facie puzzling how there could be room for a field called ‘metaphysics’ that is not itself a science and is nevertheless not a waste of time. One traditional picture imagines metaphysics as standing to physics as physics stands to biology — investigating a proprietary realm of facts that cannot even be expressed in the vocabulary of physics, and that provide “foundations” for physics in the same sense in which physics provides foundations for biology. The authors are skeptical about whether there is any such realm of facts, and thus whether there is any legitimate enterprise of investigating them. What else might “metaphysics” be, then? They have a thought: there could be room within the overall scientific project for a department whose members serve as ambassadors between the various fields of science, using their generalist training to understand how the results of the sciences can fit together into a coherent picture of the world.

Clearly it is a good idea for there to be people who devote themselves to doing this; indeed, some of them are already employed in philosophy departments. The authors propose that this activity should be called ‘metaphysics’, essentially on the grounds that among activities that are not wastes of time, it is the one that comes closest to fitting the traditional conception of metaphysics. Suppose we follow them in this — it’s only a word, after all. Then we get something that sounds a bit like the PNC: if someone is motivating a claim otherwise than by showing how it contributes to the joint explanatory power of several specific scientific theories, then that person is not doing metaphysics. Unlike the PNC, however, this principle makes no use of the concept of a “metaphysical claim”, which the authors do not define. To recover the PNC, we would need some definition like this: a metaphysical claim is a claim that can only reasonably be motivated by doing metaphysics. But this makes the PNC toothless as a criterion of methodological soundness. To apply it in any given case, we will need some independent test for establishing that the particular conclusion for which some particular analytic metaphysician argues is a “metaphysical claim” in the relevant sense — a test that we can apply before looking at the details of the argument and seeing if it works. While the authors evidently hold that many of the claims characteristic of recent analytic metaphysics fall into this category, they don’t provide any such test. Where Hume had his division between relations of ideas and matters of fact, and the positivists had their distinction between analytic and empirical truths, the authors of Every Thing Must Go have nothing more than a list of particular questions about which they think that we cannot form justified opinions without paying close attention to many scientific details. Even if they are entirely right about this, there is a huge difference between such a list and a general methodology for metaphysics.

* * * * * * * * * * *

So far I have just been talking about chapter 1 of Every Thing Must Go. In the remainder of the book, the authors attempt to do some metaphysics in the way they think it ought to be done. Let me first give some flavour of the claims they defend; later I will say something about their arguments. As the title of the book suggests, their central theme is that particular objects — ‘things’ — are metaphysically second-grade. They lack ‘primitive identity’ (143); they do not exist independently of each other (151); they are not ‘self-subsistent’ (130) and not ‘ontologically fundamental’ (130/1). What’s metaphysically first-grade are relations or relational structure: relational structure is ‘ontologically subsistent’ (152), ‘more fundamental than objects’ (145); relations are ‘primary to things’ (152); relata are ‘are constructed as abstractions from relations’ and ‘always turn out to be relational structures themselves on further analysis’ (154). They call this view ‘Ontic Structural Realism’, or OSR.

Claims of this general form — to the effect that such-and-such is more fundamental than so-and-so, or that so-and-so is constructed as an abstraction out of such-and-such — have been part of metaphysics since the pre-Socratics. The authors seem to think that contemporary analytic metaphysics is founded on the presupposition that objects are not less fundamental than, or constructed out of, relations. In this they are certainly wrong. Much work in analytic metaphysics has been characterized by a suspicion of the very concepts of ontological priority, fundamentalness, construction, etc.; this has motivated a quest to recast debates about these questions in terms of some (supposedly) better-understood concepts, such as those of metaphysical possibility and necessity.3 To the extent that analytic metaphysicians have been willing to engage in debates about ontological priority, their substantive conclusions have been wildly divergent. If there is any consensus, it is merely that those who want to defend claims about ontological priority should articulate these claims in a certain kind of detail. It is not enough simply to announce that Xs are more fundamental than Ys: if I want to defend this claim, I am supposed, at a minimum, to (i) introduce a language in which I can talk about Xs without even seeming to talk about Ys; and (ii) make some kind of adequacy claim about this language, e.g., that it can express all the genuine facts that we can express using Y-talk, or that all the Y-facts supervene on the facts stateable in the language. For example, if I want to maintain that spacetime is less fundamental than the spatiotemporal relations between bodies, I must describe a language for characterizing these relations, and explain how it can adequately capture, e.g., claims about the global topological structure of spacetime.

The authors do not submit to this discipline in any sustained way. Prima facie, if I want to describe a pattern or structure of relations, I will have to talk about the objects among which the relations hold — I will want to say, for example, that R1, R2 and R3 are such that whenever R1 holds between two objects x and y and R2 holds between x, y and some further object z, R3 holds between y and z; and so on. The authors’ position seems to require this way of talking to be dispensable - there should be some other, metaphysically more perspicuous, language which allows us to characterize “patterns of relations” without bringing in objects, such that we could sensibly raise the question whether the facts about patterns characterized in this way are, or are not, adequate to the task of capturing what we are getting at in our ordinary talk about objects. But they say almost nothing about what this language might look like. And the little they do say shows that they have not been careful to distinguish between a variety of very different proposals that might answer to slogans like ‘relations are primary to things’, ranging from the modest to the very radical:

(i) The most modest claim in the vicinity is concerned only with the status of claims about specific objects, like ‘Shergar is a quadruped’ or ‘this particle is negatively charged’. The thought is that a complete and adequate description of reality has no need for claims of this sort: everything can in principle be said using quantifiers and qualitative predicates. If one cashes this out in modal terms, one will arrive at the doctrine of "antihaecceitism": that truths about specific objects supervene on purely qualitative truths.4

(ii) A more ambitious project that answers to many of the slogans is the so-called ‘bundle theory of particulars’.5 On this view, the fundamental language can not only do without names for particular objects, it can also do without quantification over them. The work of such quantifiers will be done by primitive predicates attaching directly to relations. For example, where we would ordinarily say that there is an object that both bears R1 to something and bears R2 to something, our fundamental language will say, perhaps, that R1 and R2 are ‘compresent in the first argument place’, eschewing any analysis of this in terms of quantification. The challenge for this view is to actually fill in the list of primitive predicates in the fundamental language, in such a way that (a) it lets us express all the legitimate distinctions that we can express by quantifying over objects, and (b) it is plausibly a genuine alternative to, rather than a notational variant of, a language with quantifiers ranging over particulars.6

Many of the formulations in the book suggest views like (i) or the stronger (ii). But this surely does not exhaust what the authors are trying to do. For even the acceptance of (ii) would still leave room for disagreement about the catalogue of relations that should appear in the fundamental language. For example, even if two proponents of (ii) both accept some particular model of General Relativity as a perfectly accurate description of reality, the first might claim that the fundamental relations mentioned in the fundamental language include being farther apart than and having a greater mass-density than, while the second denies this and offers, instead, fundamental relations like being equal in volume to and containing a greater total mass than. This dispute might persist even if there is an acknowledged simple system of mappings between sentences about the first metaphysician’s relations and sentences about the second metaphysician’s relations, such that the first metaphysician accepts a given sentence iff the second metaphysician accepts its image under the mapping. It is abundantly clear that OSR is supposed to leave no room for this kind of metaphysician’s debate. For example:

According to OSR, if one were asked to present the ontology of the world according to, for example, GR one would present the apparatus of differential geometry and the field equations and then go on to explain the topology and other characteristics of the particular model (or more accurately equivalence class of diffeomorphic models) of these equations that is thought to describe the actual world. There is nothing else to be said, and presenting an interpretation that allows us to visualize the whole structure in classical terms is just not an option. Mathematical structures are used for the representation of physical structure and relations, and this kind of representation is ineliminable and irreducible in science. (159)

OSR’s purported ability to dissolve many apparent disagreements about the nature of reality plays a central role in the argument of chapter 2, which takes up themes from the debate about scientific realism. The thought is that if we take “our best theories” to be telling us about some aspect of reality that goes beyond relational structure, then a “pessimistic induction”, based on historical examples like the theories of ether and caloric, will force us to deny that we have reason to believe that they are even approximately true. By contrast, an OSR-friendly reading of caloric theory is supposed to make its truth, or at least its approximate truth, consistent with subsequent discoveries. (I found it hard to pin down exactly where OSR was supposed to defeat the pessimistic meta-induction: while OSR-savvy friends of caloric theory would not believe that caloric exists as a fundamental, “self-subsistent”, independent individual, they might still believe that caloric exists in the same ordinary, second-class sense in which water exists — and if so, wouldn’t they be wrong?) This line of thought would evidently carry no force if OSR required questions about the catalogue of fundamental relations to have objectively right answers, since scientific developments could call for quite radical changes to the catalogue.

But one cannot simply announce that such disputes are to be dissolved: one must earn the right to do so by describing a fundamental language within which no corresponding questions can be formulated. What might such a language look like? At some points, including the above quote about General Relativity, the authors seem to suggest taking as fundamental a language in which the world is described by reference to mathematical models. The idea that we should refuse to seek an account of what makes a given mathematical model an apt representation of the physical world is a recurring theme in the book. Another example:

What makes the structure physical and not mathematical? That is a question that we refuse to answer. In our view, there is nothing more to be said about this that doesn’t amount to empty words and venture beyond what the PNC allows. The ‘world-structure’ just is and exists independently of us and we represent it mathematico-physically via our theories. (158)

Perhaps, then we should attribute to them view (iii):

(iii) The fundamental language is some language adequate for pure mathematics, enriched with an additional predicate, ‘physically realized’, that attaches primitively to some mathematical entities and not to others.7

The problem with holding a view like this is that if one wants to accept principles of the form ‘if x is physically realized, and y bears such-and-such mathematical relation to x, then y is physically realized’, one must adopt them as axioms rather than deriving them as theorems from an account of what it is to be physically realized. And the authors clearly would want to accept many principles of this form - not only for isomorphism between models, but for other kinds of close relations, such as might obtain between a model for one language and a model for another language derived from the first model by some simple, invertible translation function. Some rather strong principles of this form had better be true; otherwise, the metaphysicians’ debates about the catalogue of fundamental relations will carry over unscathed into the context of view (iii), in the form of debates about the number and adicity of predicates interpreted by the physically realized model.8

It is tempting to think that one can get by with a very simple axiom: anything that stands as a structure-preserving isomorphism to a physically realized entity is itself physically realized. The problem is that the standard (set-theoretic) way of doing pure mathematics doesn’t suggest any appropriately general meaning for ‘structure-preserving isomorphism’. Rather, this kind of talk is cashed out differently depending on the kind of mathematical entities we are talking about: groups, or vector spaces, or whatever. Interestingly, category theory seems to be different: there, the notion of a structure-preserving mapping seems to be one of the central primitives of the theory. If anyone can ever succeed in explaining category theory in a way that the larger philosophical community can understand, it will be interesting to see if it lets us carve out a version of (iii) out of which a principle capable of dissolving unwanted disputes about the catalogue of relations emerges naturally, rather than having to be written in by hand.

View (iii) is intriguing and radical. But the textual evidence for attributing it to the authors is not strong. Their talk about mathematical structures as representing the “real patterns” that constitute the physical world is hard to square with the idea that there is nothing more to reality than the mathematical realm. And the little they do say about mathematical ontology suggests that they are attracted by a view on which mathematical entities have the same non-fundamental status they assign to physical objects, as opposed to the fundamental status required by (iii).

If none of the languages I have considered is adequate for capturing the fundamental facts, what is left? Perhaps our current resources just aren’t up to the task:

Certainly, the structuralist faces a challenge in articulating her views to contemporary philosophers schooled in modern logic and set theory, which retains the classical framework of individual objects represented by variables subject to predication or membership respectively. In lieu of a more appropriate framework for structuralist metaphysics, one has to resort to treating the logical variables and constants as mere placeholders which are used for the definition and description of the relevant relations even though it is the latter that bear all the ontological weight. (155)

Passages like this suggest the following alternative to (i)(iii):

(iv) Our current linguistic forms are simply not adequate to the task of characterizing the world in fundamental terms. The best we can do is to follow the via negativa: the fundamental facts are not facts about particular objects; they do not allow one to raise unwelcome questions like the one about whether mass-density relations or total mass relations are fundamental; and so on.

This is a position that deserves to be taken seriously by those who think their purchase on the notion of fundamentality is strong enough to make sense of it. The challenge for defenders of (iv) is to convey some sense of what features of our current languages could be to blame for their inadequacy. Do they have too few basic syntactic categories? Too many? Too few, or too many basic modes of syntactic composition? Without some discussion of such questions, it will be reasonable to suspect that the features of our current languages that make them seem inadequate to proponents of (iv) are not any contingent features like these, but necessary features of any coherent system of representation.

* * * * * * * * * * *

Opening up some works of analytic metaphysics, the authors found a lot of arguments they didn’t like. They concluded that they had nothing to learn from this tradition, and went on to write a book of metaphysics that is largely uninfluenced by anything written in mainstream metaphysics from the last forty years. But in focusing only on the arguments, they have missed what is best and most distinctive about the tradition they set themselves against: its gradual raising of the standards of clarity and explicitness in the statement of metaphysical claims. It is this, rather than any supposed consensus about the appropriate methods of argument, that constitutes analytic metaphysics’s strongest claim to be part of the story of the advance of human knowledge.

Ironically, analytic metaphysicians have been much more gripped by the kinds of concern that motivated Hume and the positivists than are the authors of Every Thing Must Go. Much of what is distinctive about the analytic way of doing metaphysics is meant to guard against the danger that we might accidentally lapse into nonsense, or launch into disputes that turn out to be merely verbal. This explains the focus, dominant since Quine, on theses that can be stated using familiar everyday words (‘there are no numbers’, ‘everything with more than one part is alive’, and so on). When analytic metaphysicians do introduce technical vocabulary without defining it explicitly in ordinary terms, their approach tends to be tentative and defensive: they propose logical constraints on the new vocabulary, and attempt to draw connections between it and questions expressed in more familiar terms, in the hopes of thereby imposing enough discipline on its use to fend off the charge of unintelligibility. This applies, in particular, to discussions about the “fundamental” and the “derivative”. Concerned that such discussions have, in the past, come unmoored from any standards of meaningfulness — most notoriously, in the work of the British Idealists to which Russell and Moore were reacting (and which, interestingly, has many echoes in Every Thing Must Go) — metaphysicians who are willing to talk in these terms at all have attempted to impose some discipline, by requiring those who want to claim that X is more fundamental than Y to describe an adequately expressive language for talking about X without mentioning Y. In the work of philosophers as disparate as Russell, Carnap, Prior, Armstrong and Fine, this constraint has been enormously fruitful: it has given us a much more fine-grained understanding of the range of possible views about the fundamental nature of the world, and of the challenges they face.

In rejecting the modes of argument they see as characteristic of analytic metaphysics, the authors of Every Thing Must Go have, I fear, also cut themselves off from the techniques analytic metaphysics has developed for stating claims clear and explicit enough to be worthy targets of argument. They launch straight into their own elaborate suite of arguments — from the nature of scientific progress; from various facets of modern physics up to and including quantum gravity; from claims of an anti-reductionist character made on behalf of various special sciences - while resting content with formulations of their conclusions that do not adequately discriminate between such radically dissimilar views as (i)(iv) from the previous section. The whole approach of Every Thing Must Go reflects an exaggerated sense of the importance of argument in metaphysics, and a corresponding underestimation of the difficulty of merely crafting a view coherent and explicit enough for arguments to get any grip. This is a great pity, from the point of view of anyone who shares the authors’ belief that analytic metaphysics has much to learn from a more informed engagement with modern physics and philosophy of physics. If this desirable interaction is to take place, it will have to be pushed forward by philosophers with a foot in both camps, who combine a rigorous understanding of the space of interpretative possibilities opened up by the physical theories with a metaphysician’s patience for fine distinctions and quibbling objections.9 Alas, the alienated approach of Every Thing Must Go seems likely, if it has any effect at all on analytic metaphysicians, merely to confirm a few more of them in their impression that no one has yet shown how developments in the sciences might be relevant to their concerns.

1 They object to the widespread practice of adopting such pretences, on the grounds that they can’t see what one could learn about the actual world from thought experiments about worlds in which physics works differently (25). This, however, is only as strong as their objection to the use of thought experiments in general, which is part of their more general objection to the use of “intuitions” in metaphysics, which I discuss below.

2 This formulation is from p. 30; the final version on pp. 37-8 specifies in great detail what counts as a ‘specific scientific hypothesis’, in part by appeal to the priorities of scientific research funding bodies. The differences do not matter for present purposes.

3 For example, David Lewis advocates discussion of supervenience as ‘a stripped-down form of reductionism, unencumbered by dubious denials of existence, claims of ontological priority, or claims of translatability’ (‘New Work for a Theory of Universals’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61 (1983), 343-77, at 358).

4 This doctrine is defended, e.g., in N. L. Wilson, ‘Substances without Substrata’ (Review of Metaphysics 12 (1959): 521-539). For a helpful recent discussion, see Bradford Skow, ‘Haecceitism, Anti-Haecceitism, and Possible Worlds’ (Philosophical Quarterly 58 (2008): 98-107).

5 The canonical source for this view is Bertrand Russell, An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth, London: Allen and Unwin, 1940.

6 Projects like this have been explored by analytic metaphysicians; so far, the results have not been encouraging. For some recent discussions, see John [O’Leary-]Hawthorne and Jan Cover, ‘A World of Universals’, Philosophical Studies 91 (1998): 205-219; John Hawthorne and Ted Sider, ‘Locations’, Philosophical Topics 30 (2002): 53-76; Jason Turner, ‘Ontological Nihilism’, in Oxford Studies in Metaphysics vol. 6, ed. Dean Zimmerman (Oxford UP, 2010).

7 While analytic metaphysicians have not paid much attention to this view, a view quite like (iii) was seriously entertained by Quine (‘Whither Physical Objects?’, in Essays in Memory of Imre Lakatos, ed. R. Cohen, P. Feyerabend, and M. Wartofsky, (Dordrecht: D. Reidel): 497-504). A more radical vision, which dispenses with the ‘physically realized’ primitive in favour of a view on which every appropriately complex mathematical object has its own population of objects and people just as real as us and our surroundings, has recently been defended by the physicist Max Tegmark (‘The mathematical universe’, Foundations of Physics 38 (2008): 101-150).

8 The authors’ embrace of realism about “objective modality”, and their insistence that the kind of structure that they want to take as fundamental is “modal structure”, suggests that if they were to endorse a view like (iii), it would have some further primitive for distinguishing those mathematical entities that could be physically realized from the rest. I can’t see how this makes the present task any easier.

9 For a sense of some of the possibilities, see Tim Maudlin, The Metaphysics Within Physics (Oxford UP, 2007).