Everyday Aesthetics

Placeholder book cover

Yuriko Saito, Everyday Aesthetics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 273pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199278350.

Reviewed by Tom Leddy, San José State University


The young but growing field of everyday aesthetics is blessed with the recent publication of Yuriko Saito's book by the same name. As Saito observes, aesthetics has been changing. The aesthetics of nature and the aesthetics of popular arts have become established sub-disciplines. The next area should be in everyday aesthetics. Saito's unique background, as a teacher of philosophical aesthetics at the Rhode Island Institute of Design, and as a native of Japan with a special interest in Japanese aesthetics, has contributed to her effort in everyday aesthetics. For example, her work in Japanese aesthetics, where distinctions between fine and applied arts are not as strong as in the West, led her to think philosophically about such things as cooking and packaging. She includes a feminist dimension in her project insofar as she addresses the domestic domain in ways that have been neglected.

Saito's approach is inspired by environmental aesthetics. However, whereas environmental aesthetics is usually limited to built or natural environments, everyday aesthetics covers much more, for example personal grooming, pet choice, and garden design. A unique aspect of this book is its emphasis on the action-oriented, non-disinterested nature of aesthetic judgment in everyday life. For example, Saito points out that if we judge something messy it is natural for us to try to clean it up. This pragmatist dimension is also related to an overall interest in the relationship between everyday aesthetics and morality.

In her first chapter Saito notes two reasons for the neglect of everyday aesthetics. First, aesthetics has been, until recently, art-centered. Moreover, the art that takes the central role in aesthetics is paradigmatic Western work such as Rembrandt's and Beethoven's. Even when everyday aesthetics is discussed, it is in terms of this art-centered tradition. Yet, she argues, this approach neglects the rich and diverse content of everyday aesthetics. Saito also points to ways in which changes in the artworld (through work by such artists as James Turrell and Vito Acconci, as well as a new interest in non-Western art) have led to a greater interest in everyday aesthetics. While these innovative works often are understood only by audiences familiar with the artworld, everyday aesthetic experience is open to all. For example, the ordinary farmer may experience numerous aesthetic satisfactions in his or her daily life. To analyze such experiences in terms of even unconventional art would be misleading. Saito is right that philosophers interested in everyday phenomena spend too much time thinking about the non-arthood of non-art objects.

The second reason for neglect of the everyday is that traditional aesthetics tends to be oriented towards special experiences and hence away from life as it is ordinarily experienced. Following her action-oriented approach, Saito thinks that such non-special experiences as noticing that something is an eyesore and then wanting to clean it constitute an important aspect of everyday aesthetics.

In her second chapter, Saito gives reasons for one type of significance for everyday aesthetics. She observes that consumer choices that are not environmentally sustainable are often governed by aesthetic principles. Once again, she is critical of art-based approaches to aesthetics. For example, she notes that learning to see unscenic nature as aesthetic via artworks can backfire because we may be disappointed when we see the real thing. Instead, she argues, we should be educated to the consequences of our aesthetic preferences. This is in line with the well-known views of Allen Carlson on science-based appreciation of the aesthetics of nature, although she does question the position, sometimes associated with Carlson, that ecological value determines aesthetic value.

The third chapter asserts that although appreciation of everyday phenomena needs to be encouraged, this should be tempered by moral considerations. Saito emphasizes that if a thing exhibits its quintessential character then it is aesthetic. The Japanese in particular have taken this approach. For example, early Japanese garden theorists believed that the character of individual rocks should be respected. This emphasis was also found in the European "arts and crafts" movement of 19th century with its valuation of "truth to materials." Additionally, Saito explores the multi-sensory aspect of everyday aesthetics, for example, in eating and in the overall experience of a place. She revisits the moral dimension, noting how we feel uneasy when we encounter an exquisite expression of the defining character of something morally abhorrent or unpleasant such as a derelict ghetto or a place devastated by disaster. Saito resolves this problem by distinguishing between two senses of aesthetic appreciation, one that endorses the object's continued existence, and one that does not. Moral and aesthetic issues also intertwine when communities insist on aesthetic regulations. Here, Saito calls for us to avoid "aesthetic tyranny" by looking carefully at context and not simply rejecting what we might consider an "eyesore."

The fourth chapter considers such qualities as "neat," "clean," and "dilapidated." Drawing on her Japanese background, Saito emphasizes that these qualities all relate to the idea of transience. Here she discusses specifics of everyday life such as mowing a lawn and cleaning a room. After acknowledging my work on the qualities of neatness and messiness, Saito expands the field, adding qualities of growth, decay, and signs of aging. She also discusses different attitudes to such processes, including resignation and celebration, and the ethical advantages and disadvantages of each. The overall emphasis of the chapter is on our generally negative attitudes to such things as disorder, mess and filth. Saito stresses that objects have an optimal state from which they decline, and she notes that terms like "decay" and "get dirty" reflect this. As with "eyesore" in the previous chapter, she finds application of such terms as "dirty" and "messy" to be context-dependent, even upon the context of our expectations and attitudes. Some objects in some contexts demand perfect organization, whereas some objects in other contexts do not. In fact, disorder and clutter are sometimes expected and even found charming, as in a Chinatown shop.

Saito seems to believe that the aesthetics of everyday life should mainly be supportive of such virtues as neatness and order, although she allows for some exceptions. As she puts it: "Domestic space as a lived space certainly should be cleaned, tidied up, and organized, but it should also allow some degree of mess and disorganization." (169) Although she allows celebration of the Japanese concept of wabi she insists that this does not sanction celebration of anything imperfect, insufficient or disorderly. Also she observes that the items of wabi sensibility found in the Japanese tea ceremony are experienced in the context of an artform. They take us away from the everyday in the same way that she believes contemporary art does.

Saito's fifth chapter deals with the ways we handle moral-aesthetic judgments of artifacts. First, she establishes that there are such things as moral-aesthetic judgments. She then explores such things as proper personal appearance, environmental eyesores, and designing for special needs. Japanese examples of sensitivity to the temporal aspect of experience are explored in spatial design, food service, and package design. Saito observes that we often criticize artifacts by attributing moral qualities to them, for example "respect," "considerateness," and "sensitivity." For instance, we may say that a piece of good design shows "care," or that Japanese wrapping shows "kind consideration." Although these might be called expressive qualities, we are not usually concerned here with what the maker intended to express, which results in our interest being very unlike our interest in fine art. Saito also advocates seeing feelings of comfort and discomfort as aesthetic matters insofar as they are responses to the sensuous qualities of objects around us and to our environment.

It could be said, generally, that in this book Saito seeks first to advocate for the field of everyday aesthetics and second to describe a path within that field. She believes there are two ways to appreciate the everyday, first as a search for the extraordinary in the ordinary (what she calls a "normative" approach), and second by an emphasis on that which is ordinary in the ordinary (what she calls a "descriptive" approach). (This is somewhat confusing since the "normative" approach is associated with more traditional theories that de-emphasized moral considerations, whereas the "descriptive" approach emphasizes these considerations.) Although she sometimes implies that both approaches are important, Saito associates the first with the much-attacked theories of aesthetic attitude and disinterestedness. Her sympathy seems mainly to be with the second. This can be seen in her efforts to emphasize the moral dimension of everyday aesthetics.

Although I agree with almost everything she says I am uncomfortable with Saito's approach to both contemporary avant-garde art and the Japanese Tea Ceremony and their respective relations to everyday aesthetics. She thinks there is an irresolvable tension between art's recent aspiration to emulate life and its placement within the artworld. I think she is right about this, but am convinced that contemporary art still plays an important role in getting us to notice the everyday. Nor am I convinced that interest in the aesthetic qualities of such ordinary things as neatening a room should lead to downplaying the extraordinary in everyday life. Saito thinks that in focusing on the extraordinary in the ordinary we lose "the dimension of personal engagement that characterizes our dealing with everyday environment and objects." (202) But is the extraordinary any less personal? I agree that we should attend not only to the rewards of aestheticizing such things as transience and decay but also to the more common role that negative reaction to such qualities plays in our lives. And yet, is it even possible to approach the ordinariness of the ordinary without making it extraordinary, without approaching it, therefore, in an art-like way? I question, finally, whether we should try so hard to keep everyday aesthetics free from analysis derived from the aesthetics of art.

One unique aspect of Saito's analysis is the stress she places on the moral dimension of everyday aesthetics. First, she stresses the social importance of everyday aesthetic choices. If people value the greenness of a lawn, there are environmental consequences. Second, she tells us about how aestheticization of certain phenomena can cause social harm: for example, the Japanese in the last century associated their native landscape with militarist nationalism. Third, she stresses the ways that people are judged both in moral and aesthetic terms. Only the last of these seems problematic to me. There are admirable people who are not committed to conventional middle-class values of neatness and order. Should they be judged aesthetically/morally in terms of those values? In this respect, it is surprising to find an avowed feminist sympathetic, as Saito seems to be, to Dickens' implicit criticism of Mrs. Jellyby in Bleak House as having allowed her house to become untidy because of her interest in social problems. (161)

In conclusion, Everyday Aesthetics is a well-argued and ground-breaking piece of philosophy which has much to say about issues in contemporary philosophy of art and design theory while also helping to form a new sub-discipline within aesthetics. It also has the advantage of being immensely readable. I have not had time to address many of Saito's illuminating discussions e.g., of the intriguing idea that aestheticizing the evanescence of aged objects actually helps us take a more positive attitude towards them, and that the Japanese also aestheticize such things as insufficiency and imperfection to good effect. Unlike many philosophical works this book offers reflections on practical matters that affect us all. It really has to do with how we ought to live our lives. And one senses that if we followed Saito's lead we would find our lives filled with heightened aesthetic and moral sensitivity to our surroundings. This perhaps is the most important thing in an age in which environmental sustainability has become the crucial issue.