Everything in Everything: Anaxagoras's Metaphysics

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Anna Marmodoro, Everything in Everything: Anaxagoras's Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2017, 214 pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190611972.

Reviewed by John Palmer, University of Florida


Anna Marmodoro's Anaxagoras is a power ontologist with a theory of extreme mixture that makes his world gunky rather than atomic. The fundamental elements of his physical system -- the hot and the cold, the moist and the dry, and so on -- are tropes that are physical but not material: they are instances of opposite physical properties that are not borne by any material substratum. They are also instances of causal powers that are constantly active and exercising their constitutional causal role, though they are manifest only at higher concentrations within the bundles constituting stuffs and organisms. Because Marmodoro's Anaxagoras rejects the possibility of creation from, or destruction into, nothing, and also the possibility that anything might come to be from what it is not, he allows for unrestricted derivation, such that anything may come from anything. This is possible because of his still more basic tenet that everything is in everything. As Anaxagoras himself says, "all things possess a portion of every thing" (panta pantos moiran metechei, ANAXAG. D25 Laks-Most = 59B6 Diels-Kranz). The explication of this startling claim is the central focus of Marmodoro's monograph.

After an introductory chapter on the fundamental items in Anaxagoras's ontology, the book's central chapters explicate the metaphysical underpinnings of his physical system by first providing an overview of its fundamental principles (Chapter 2), presenting and defending Marmodoro's novel interpretation of the everything in everything principle (Chapter 3), and defending her reading via a critique of other interpretations (Chapter 4). There follows a discussion of the principles Anaxagoras calls "seeds" and "nous" as the intelligent powers that provide, respectively, structures for the growth of living things and a cosmic plan for the universe (Chapter 5). A final chapter is devoted to Stoic physical theory insofar as it shares with Anaxagoras the core metaphysical assumption of a gunky reality (Chapter 6).

Anaxagoras's claim that all things possess a portion of every thing is a principle of composition that is grounded in more fundamental principles of physical structure. These are the principles that there is no least magnitude, that there is no greatest magnitude, and a principle of the isometry of small and large, according to which any portion of stuff has as many portions smaller than it as portions larger than it. He also introduces -- as additional principles of composition -- the principle of inseparability, according to which no stuff can be discrete, separate, and isolated from other stuffs once it has been mixed with other stuffs, and a principle of preponderance, according to which a thing's phenomenal characteristics are a function of the preponderance within it of stuffs with the corresponding characters. It is important to distinguish the principles of physical structure from the principles of composition, since Anaxagoras intends the former to ground the latter (see ANAXAG. D25 Laks-Most = 59B6 Diels-Kranz). Marmodoro's articulation and discussion of the principles serves as preparation for her central contention that Anaxagorean mixture is to be understood in terms of the necessary compresence of everything with everything rather than in terms of the constitutional containment of everything in everything. "For Anaxagoras there is a share of everything with everything," she explains, "rather than a share of everything contained in everything" (pp. 75-6).

What does Marmodoro's central contention amount to? On her admittedly speculative reconstruction of how Anaxagoras can derive the Inseparability principle from what she calls the No-Least principle, properties such as hot and cold, like large and small, exist on a scale of intensity with no upper or lower limit such that "there are no extremes to the degree of intensity of an opposite" (p. 79). Inseparability follows, in that any given instance of a property that has an opposite will also be an instance of its opposite since, for example, anything that is hot is also cold relative to things farther along the scale of intensity. Thus "every instance of one of a pair of opposites is also an instance of the other opposite" (p. 80).

While this line of argument yields only the inseparability of any pair of opposites, Marmodoro suggests that the more general inseparability of all opposites is secured by another line of reasoning depending on the No-Least principle, since it commits Anaxagoras to the fundamental elements being unlimited in both number and smallness, so that the elements are continuum dense. This reconstruction yields her understanding of how everything is in everything: "All opposites are unlimited in smallness, unlimited in numerical and total amounts, inseparable from one another, and compresent with one another -- and it is in this sense they are all together in everything" (p. 83). It is somewhat unclear how much this ultimately differs from the alternative Marmodoro wants to reject, for the compresence of opposites is only physically possible because every portion of stuff contains a portion of all the opposites.

Marmodoro is right to emphasize that opposites exist on a continuum of degrees. But it remains to be explained how Anaxagoras conceives, for example, of something very hot not being absolutely hot. He apparently thinks that the heat of anything hot is accounted for, according to the principle of preponderance, by its having within it a preponderance of the hot over the cold; yet the preponderance is never so great as to absolutely exclude the simultaneous presence of the cold within it, although to a lesser degree. If degrees of intensity are to be accounted for in terms of the preponderance of the opposites, then Anaxagoras's principle of everything in everything needs to be understood both in terms of necessary compresence and in terms of constitutional containment. Containment is the more fundamental conception, because it explains how compresence is possible. Marmodoro's emphasis on the compresence aspect of the everything in everything principle is a useful contribution to its understanding, but she goes too far in rejecting the containment aspect. Anaxagoras does say, after all, that "all things are in every thing" (en panti panta), that "all things possess a portion of every thing" (panta pantos moiran metechei), and again that "in every thing there is a portion of every thing" (ANAXAG. D25 and D26 Laks-Most = 59B6 and B11 Diels-Kranz).

Although she explicitly rejects attempts to understand Anaxagoras's everything in everything principle in terms of constitutional containment, Marmodoro nonetheless recognizes that the opposites "each divide into unlimitedly many, unlimitedly small parts or instances" (p. 75). The previous interpretations of the everything in everything principle she criticizes in Chapter 4 all attempt to provide a coherent articulation of the theory of physical or material structure based on the fundamental no least magnitude principle, so as to make the everything in everything principle intelligible. The suggestion to understand that principle in terms of the compresence rather than the containment of opposites does not obviate the need for an account of Anaxagoras's theory of physical or material structure. Thus, after presenting her compresence interpretation of the everything in everything principle, she turns in Chapter 3 to articulating the view that Anaxagorean reality is made of atomless gunk, meaning that it is endlessly divided into ever smaller parts. Anaxagorean gunk is power gunk, on Marmodoro's interpretation, because his physical principles, the opposites, are not strictly material, but tropes that do not qualify any material substratum (pp. 17-22, 85).

Despite her rejection of containment interpretations of the everything in everything principle, Marmodoro has her own view of how Anaxagoras's physical theory makes it possible for everything to be in everything: "the fact that opposites for Anaxagoras are actually gunky does facilitate the extreme mixture and inseparability of the shares that Anaxagoras wants, because of the numerosity of the shares that exist in nature" (p. 86). The latter half of Chapter 3, one of the most original and stimulating stretches of the book, explores the ramifications of modelling Anaxagorean reality as gunky in this way. What emerges is that because the parts of each opposite approach zero extension, the shares of the opposites can overlap with every other space; and because each kind of opposite is unlimited and their shares can overlap in this way, "each kind of opposite can be everywhere, and thus there is no region of space that will lack any kind of being in it" (p. 187).

Marmodoro understands Anaxagoras's ingenious physical theory as attempting to abide by Parmenidean constraints on change in positing that there is no creation ex nihilo, no emergence of substances or qualities, and no qualitative alteration of the opposites over time (p. 27). However, the common view that the Presocratic pluralists including Anaxagoras, Empedocles, and the early atomists were all reacting to a Parmenidean challenge to the reality of plurality and change typically has it that their various responses all involved positing a plurality of principles possessing the attributes Parmenides had ascribed to his one being: "What Is is ungenerated and deathless, | whole and uniform, and still and perfect" (PARM. D6.3-4 Laks-Most = 28B8.3-4 Diels Kranz). While the Anaxagorean opposites are certainly meant to be ungenerated and deathless or imperishable, because they are thoroughly mixed with all the other opposites and undergoing continual rearrangement, no Anaxagorean opposite can be regarded as whole and uniform or as still (i.e. unmoving) and perfect in the way Parmenides envisages.

Once one recognizes that Anaxagoras's opposites cannot have been meant to be a plurality of Parmenidean entities, then one might well question whether Anaxagoras intended to abide by specifically Parmenidean prohibitions against change. Setting aside the fact that there are serious problems with the common view that Parmenides prohibits all change and becoming, Anaxagoras's declaration that the Greeks misconceive coming to be and being destroyed, since no thing in fact comes to be or is destroyed; rather there is only mixing and separation out of the things that are (ANAXAG. D15 Laks-Most = 59B17 Diels-Kranz), is best understood as a formulation of the principles nihil ex nihilo fit and its corollary regarding destruction into nothingness that Aristotle repeatedly and correctly indicates were endorsed by all the earlier natural philosophers (e.g. Arist. Ph. I 4 187a27-9, 34-5, Metaph. Κ 6 1062b24-6).

A purported paraphrase by a scholiast commenting on the 4th c. Archbishop of Constantinople Gregory of Nazianzus is the primary evidence for supposing that Anaxagoras intended to abide by the more restrictive principle that nothing comes to be from what it is not:

How could it be possible, he says, that out of non-hair hair could ever come to be, and flesh out of non-flesh? He made these assertions not only about bodies but also about colors. For he said that in black there is present white, and white in black. He posited the same thing about weights, supposing that the light is mixed with the heavy and inversely the latter with the former (Greg. Naz. Orat. 9, vol. 36, p. 911B-C Migne = ANAXAG. D21 Laks-Most = 59B10 Diels-Kranz).

Some non-arbitrary restriction on this principle is necessary on pain of absurdity, for it would otherwise apparently require Anaxagoras to include in his primordial soup homunculi of all individual organisms that will ever exist. Marmodoro attempts to respond to this problem without succumbing to it (pp. 24-31), though with less than total success. She wants to say that Anaxagoras's principle of preponderance entails that there is "phenomenological emergence" of stuffs, objects, and organisms, while they all remain fully reducible to the opposites from which they are composed.

She would do better to allow for genuine emergence within Anaxagoras's system -- and also to allow that the opposites themselves may change when they causally interact. Allowing for these possibilities would make for a better fit with her interpretation of Anaxagorean reality as gunky. Instead, she feels that if the opposites were to change when they interact, "there would be a passage from nonbeing to being, which would defy Anaxagoras's explicit endorsement of Parmenidean principles" (37-8). But there is no such endorsement, and it is an unnecessary and ahistorical restriction on the reconstruction of his physical theory to disallow qualitative alteration at the level of the opposites or the generation of new types of entity from them. Both restrictions are problematic: the latter because his theory would otherwise seem designed to explain the generation of complex entities from pre-existing entities in a non-reductive manner, and the former because it tends to push the theory in the direction of atomism, which Marmodoro rightly wants to avoid.

Any attempt to provide a coherent account of Anaxagoras's physical theory consistent with the extant evidence is perhaps bound to encounter difficulties, since the theory itself was in all probability less than fully coherent. Although Marmodoro's account has its difficulties, the refreshing originality of its conception and its vision of Anaxagoras through the lens of contemporary metaphysical concerns should inspire philosophers who have only a vague idea of Anaxagoras's achievement to take up the texts for themselves. Her arguments and readings should also inspire those who are well versed in this evidence to see it in new ways. Anyone tempted to think there is little philosophy among the Presocratics will find in Marmodoro's monograph a provocative case to the contrary.