Evidence, Decision and Causality

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Arif Ahmed, Evidence, Decision and Causality, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 250pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107020894.

Reviewed by Paul Weirich, University of Missouri


Does rational choice aim for an option that is efficacious or for an option that is auspicious? Does it aim for good effects or for good news? Although in most cases efficacy and auspiciousness go hand in hand, in some cases, such as Newcomb's problem, an auspicious option is not efficacious. These cases launch the debate between causal decision theory (CDT), which advocates efficacy, and evidential decision theory (EDT), which advocates auspiciousness.

This book defends EDT, pointing out its virtues and criticizing the arguments for CDT. It examines L.J. Savage's and Richard Jeffrey's representation theorems, objections to CDT involving non-ratifiable options, the tickle defense of EDT in realistic versions of Newcomb's problem, a quantum-mechanical version of Newcomb's problem, and Frank Ramsey's account of an act's evidential import given the agent's perspective and given an observer's perspective.

Newcomb's problem divides CDT and EDT. In this problem an agent decides whether to take an opaque box by itself or the opaque box and also another transparent box. The transparent box contains a thousand dollars, and the opaque box contains either nothing or a million dollars depending on a reliable prediction of the agent's choice. Given a prediction of one-boxing, a million dollars went into the opaque box; and given a prediction of two-boxing, nothing went into the opaque box. The agent knows all this prior to choosing. Hence, for the agent, taking just the opaque box is a sign that it contains a million dollars. Good news! However, because the contents of the opaque box were settled before the choice, taking just the opaque box has no good effect on its contents. On the other hand, taking both boxes, although bad news about the prospects of becoming a millionaire, has the good effect of increasing the agent's wealth by a thousand dollars whatever the contents of the opaque box. Because EDT attends to the news options bring, it advocates one-boxing; whereas CDT, attending to options' effects, advocates two-boxing.

Jeffrey ([1965] 1990) supplies the version of EDT that the book defends, and Lewis (1981) supplies the version of CDT that the book criticizes, although its criticisms also apply to other versions of CDT, such as the one that Gibbard and Harper ([1978] 1981) advance. Ahmed argues that EDT yields rational decisions and is simpler than CDT because EDT does not rely on information about causal relations. To show that EDT yields rational decisions, he analyzes many cases, including Newcomb's problem.

A common argument for one-boxing in Newcomb's problem, which Chapter 7 endorses, notes that one-boxers gain more on average than two-boxers gain. The one-boxers may taunt the two-boxers, who claim to be rational, "If you're so smart, why aincha rich?" Causalists generally reply that events may conspire to reward irrationality, as they do in Newcomb's problem. They concede that an agent who foresees facing Newcomb's problem may before the prediction rationally, if possible, make himself a one-boxer, but they still maintain that one-boxing itself is an irrational choice.

To support the rationality of one-boxing in Newcomb's problem, Ahmed also appeals to similar cases in which, he contends, choices similar to one-boxing are rational. He calls one such case Betting on the Past (p. 120). In this case Alice chooses between two bets: (1) a bet that wins ten dollars if the proposition P holds and loses one dollar otherwise and (2) a bet that wins one dollar if P holds and loses ten dollars otherwise. P is the proposition that the past state of the world was such as to cause Alice now to take the second bet. Alice is highly confident that her choice is free and yet determined. According to EDT, taking the second bet is Alice's rational choice because taking this bet yields evidence that P is true and that she therefore gains a dollar, whereas taking the first bet yields evidence that P is false and that she therefore loses a dollar. In contrast, CDT claims that taking the first bet is rational because whether or not P is true, the first bet makes Alice better off by nine dollars than she would be if she took the second bet.

Ahmed argues that intuition favors the second bet and so supports EDT. In reply, CDT maintains that although Alice's taking the first bet yields evidence that P is false and that she will lose a dollar, nonetheless, given that P is false Alice would lose even more money if she were to take the second bet. The case resembles Newcomb's problem with an inerrant predictor. In this variant of Newcomb's problem, evidentialists reduce the problem to a choice between the million dollars that one-boxing indicates and the thousand dollars that two-boxing indicates, and then recommend one-boxing. Causalists maintain that despite the prediction's inerrancy, one-boxing is still irrational because it still forgoes a sure thousand dollars.

Causalists appeal to the principle of dominance, one version of which prohibits adopting an option strictly dominated by another option, that is, such that the first option has a worse outcome than the second option in every member of a partition of states of the world. Ahmed (p. 32) maintains that the principle of dominance applies only given that the states are evidentially independent of the options, whereas CDT maintains that the principle applies only given that the states are causally independent of the options. The debate between EDT and CDT extends to formulations of the principle of dominance, so appeal to the principle does not yield a decisive case for two-boxing in Newcomb's problem.

Proponents of CDT commonly argue that in Newcomb's problem one-boxing is not rational because even if the opaque box contains a million dollars, as the choice indicates, two-boxing would bring an additional thousand dollars. Ahmed (p. 202) takes this reasoning to be committed to the following could-have-done-better principle: if you know that a certain option makes you worse off, given your situation, than you would have been on some identifiable alternative, then that first option is irrational. He also assumes (p. 211) that any decision theory that adopts this principle for a single choice is committed to adopting a similar principle for a sequence of choices: if you know that a certain available sequence of choices makes you worse off, given your situation, than you would have been on some identifiable alternative, then that first sequence is irrational. He argues that CDT cannot adopt the could-have-done-better principle because in some cases following its analogue for sequences leads to a sequence of choices that is irrational according to CDT.

To demonstrate, he constructs the two-stage Newcomb-Insurance problem. The problem's first stage is a variant of Newcomb's problem in which the transparent box is empty, and the opaque box contains a hundred dollars if and only if one-boxing was predicted. In the problem's second stage, the agent, before opening the opaque box, decides to bet whether or not the prediction was right. Betting that it was right yields twenty-five dollars if it was right and loses seventy-five dollars otherwise. Betting that it was wrong yields seventy-five dollars if it was wrong and loses twenty-five dollars otherwise. Ahmed argues that in the Newcomb-Insurance problem a follower of CDT makes a sequence of choices worse than an alternative sequence and so violates the could-have-done-better principle. For instance, the follower of CDT may two-box and then bet that the prediction was correct for a net gain of twenty-five dollars. However, one-boxing and then betting that the prediction was wrong nets seventy-five dollars.

The objection to CDT depends on the could-have-done-better principle's extension from a single choice to a sequence of choices. CDT may adopt the principle for a single choice but reject its analogue for a sequence of choices. Ahmed doubts (p. 211) that CDT has any motivation for this defense. However,Weirich (2010: 27-29) presents a motivation that appeals to types of control that an agent has over options. An agent has direct control over the options in a decision problem and only indirect control over the sequences of options possible in a sequence of decision problems. Rationality evaluates an option in an agent's direct control by comparing it with alternatives and evaluates a sequence in an agent's indirect control by evaluating the directly controlled options in the sequence.

Chapter 3 considers an objection to CDT that Egan (2007) advances using his case of the button that kills all psychopaths. Considering consequences, pushing the button has greater expected utility than not pushing for an agent who is confident that he is not a psychopath. However, only a psychopath would push the button, so pushing seems suicidal. A causalist response may distinguish principles of evaluation and principles of choice, as does Joyce (2012). Although CDT gives pushing higher expected utility than not pushing, it may adopt a principle of choice that uses conditional expected utility. If an option's realization provides evidence about the option's effects, its expected utility may not equal its expected utility given its realization, according to CDT's method of computing an option's expected utility and its self-conditional expected utility. Although one option may have higher expected utility than another option, the first option, considering its expected utility given its realization, may not be more choiceworthy than the second option, as Weirich (2004: chap. 8) explains. CDT may therefore recommend not pushing the button despite that option's having lower expected utility than pushing the button.

Ahmed holds (pp. 67-68) that CDT may not reply this way to an elaboration of the button case. In the elaboration a single agent faces three decision problems. The agent enters each problem confident that he is not a psychopath. The first problem involves two options A and Z. Option A is pressing a button that kills all psychopaths, and option Z is doing nothing. Pressing A creates evidence that the agent is a psychopath. So intuition suggests option Z. The second problem involves option B and option Z. Option B is pressing a button that incurs a small cost and kills all psychopaths, but pressing it does not create evidence that the agent is a psychopath. Option Z is, again, doing nothing. Because the agent prefers a world without psychopaths, CDT recommends option B. The third problem involves options A and B from the first and second problems, respectively. Because the two options have the same effects, but option B incurs a cost, CDT recommends option A. According to CDT's resolutions of the second and third decision problems, a rational agent prefers B to Z and prefers A to B. However, if the agent also prefers Z to A, the agent's preferences among the three options are not transitive; the agent prefers A to B and B to Z, but not A to Z. Ahmed claims that CDT is forced, contrary to intuition, to endorse A in the first decision problem to prevent non-transitive preferences among options.

A causalist has available at least one line of reply. The objection to CDT assumes that changing the set of options in a decision problem does not change the grounds of preference among the options. Weirich (2004: p. 159) reviews opposition to this assumption, especially opposition that arises given that conditional expected utilities play a role in rational choice. Given the assumption's rejection, CDT may accept non-transitive preferences in Ahmed's three decision problems. Its principle of transitivity applies if the grounds of preference are constant. If a change in decision problem changes the grounds of preference, it may permit a change in preference between two options, and thus not require transitivity for preferences among options in the three decision problems.

Chapter 8 presents strong, naturalistic objections to Ramsey's thesis "that a rational deliberating agent must take his presently contemplated acts to be evidentially irrelevant to anything then in his past" (pp. 215-216). Although CDT is not committed to Ramsey's thesis, Ahmed extends his objections from Ramsey's thesis to CDT, and so CDT needs a reply to this extension.

The chapter's objection to CDT arises in Ahmed's two-stage Psycho-Insurance problem. In the first stage an agent decides whether to press a button that loses a dollar if pressing was predicted and wins a dollar if not pressing was predicted. The prediction is right at least seventy-five percent of the time. In the second stage the agent decides, before learning the prediction, whether to bet a dollar and a half at odds of one to three that the prediction was correct. Applying backward induction to the sequence of choices, a follower of CDT foresees that in the second stage he will make the bet because the odds are favorable and then in the first stage, to maximize expected utility given his betting behavior, does not push the button. The objection to CDT observes that pushing the button and not making the bet is a better sequence of choices whether or not pushing the button was predicted. In reply, CDT may reject applying the principle of strict dominance to a sequence of choices, especially if earlier choices provide evidence concerning states that settle their effects and the effects of later choices. CDT may maintain that a sequence of choices is rational if the choices in the sequence are rational, and its classification of an option as rational may consider the option's expected utility given its realization, as the discussion of Chapter 3 notes.

Ahmed's book on the debate between EDT and CDT is a very welcome addition to the literature in decision theory. It is a very subtle and finely crafted review of the principal points pertinent to an adjudication of the debate. Both sides of the debate have much to learn from Ahmed's precise formulation and thorough assessment of these points. He casts old arguments in new light and constructs new arguments with great ingenuity to produce a spirited defense of EDT. I heartily recommend this book to all decision theorists.


Egan, A. 2007. "Some Counterexamples to Causal Decision Theory." Philosophical Review 116: 93-114.

Gibbard, A. and W. Harper. [1978] 1981. "Counterfactuals and Two Kinds of Expected Utility." In W. Harper, R. Stalnaker, and G. Pearce, eds., Ifs: Conditional, Belief, Decision, Chance, and Time, pp. 153-190. Dordrecht: Reidel.

Jeffrey, R. [1965] 1990. The Logic of Decision. Second edition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Joyce, J. 2012. "Regret and Instability in Causal Decision Theory." Synthese 187: 123-145.

Lewis, D. 1981. "Causal Decision Theory." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 59: 5-30.

Weirich, P. 2004. Realistic Decision Theory: Rules for Nonideal Agents in Nonideal Circumstances. New York: Oxford University Press.

Weirich, P. 2010. Collective Rationality: Equilibrium in Cooperative Games. New York: Oxford University Press.