Evidentialism and Epistemic Justification

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Kevin McCain, Evidentialism and Epistemic Justification, Routledge, 2014, 172pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415714822.

Reviewed by Todd R. Long, California Polytechnic State University


Evidentialism is the view that the doxastic attitudes that are epistemically justified/rational for a person to have are those that fit (or support) the person’s evidence. The thought that we need reasons, via evidence, in order to have rational belief is among the more compelling, common sense ideas in philosophy. Indeed, until recent times it didn’t occur to philosophers that what is nowadays called ‘epistemic justification/rationality’ might be about anything other than having evidence. Nevertheless, today there are evidentialist detractors. Although many critics of evidentialism have displayed an astonishing lack of imagination or a failure to exercise the principle of charity,1 some criticisms and challenges deserve careful attention. In this book, Kevin McCain argues for a theory that not only withstands the better challenges to evidentialism but also rekindles hope that the commonsense idea tying epistemic justification to having evidence can be worked out in full-fledged theory.

McCain’s main goals are to defend and promote the mentalist internalism that Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (1985, 2001, 2004, 2008) have been developing for some time and to fill in undeveloped details in Conee-Feldman style evidentialism concerning the nature of evidence, epistemic support, and the basing relation. The result, McCain says, is to be a complete evidentialist theory of doxastic epistemic justification (or “well-founded belief”). Along the way, McCain addresses the pertinent literature — deftly replying to criticisms from epistemologists such as Thomas Kelly, Timothy Williamson, Clayton Littlejohn, Trent Dougherty, Jonathan Vogel, John Kvanvig, Ryan Byerly, John Greco, Andrew Moon, and Jason Baehr. The result is a lean, muscular, well-argued presentation of what comes closer to a complete theory of epistemic justification in the spirit of Conee-Feldman style evidentialism than we have ever seen before. It is definitely required reading for epistemologists.In what follows, I state details of the theory, register some ways it differs from other explanationist theories, and offer some criticism.

McCain intends his theory to spell out the details of the following Conee-Feldman style evidentialist account of well-founded belief:

S’s doxastic attitude D at t toward proposition p is well-founded if and only if S has D toward p on the basis of some body of evidence e, such that

(a)   S has e as evidence at t;

(b)  having D toward p fits e; and

(c)   there is no more inclusive body of evidence e’ had by S at t such that having D toward p does not fit e’. (9)

To fill out the details of this schema, McCain provides accounts of its key concepts.

What is evidence? Starting with the idea that evidence is what one has to go on in forming a belief or the reasons for which one believes, McCain says “evidence is good reasons that are indicative of the truth concerning the proposition that is the object of the doxastic attitude” (10). This prompts the metaphysical question: what are such good reasons? Basic answers come in the form of psychologism (evidence consists of psychological things) and anti-psychologism (evidence consists of non-psychological things, e.g., propositions). In rejecting anti-psychologism, McCain persuasively objects to arguments from Williamson (2000) and Littlejohn (2012); and, in supporting a non-factive version of psychologism, McCain impressively rebuts Williamson’s influential ‘knowledge first’ view according to which only knowledge is evidence. McCain concludes that evidence consists solely of non-factive mental states or events that represent the world as being a particular way. The motivations for this view influence many aspects of McCain’s overall theory: one motivation is the intuition behind the New Evil Demon Problem (we have the same epistemically justified doxastic attitudes as our introspectively identical twins whose mental states are controlled by a Cartesian evil demon); the other motivations constitute crucial principles of Conee-Feldman mentalist internalism: “The justificatory status of a person’s doxastic attitudes strongly supervene on the person’s occurrent and dispositional mental states, events, and conditions”, and “If any two possible individuals are exactly alike mentally, then they are alike justificationally, e.g., the same beliefs are justified for them to the same extent” (cited, 11).

What does it mean to have evidence? McCain argues for a moderate view that he calls

MVP*: S has p available as evidence relevant to q at t iff at t S is currently aware of p or S is disposed to bring p to mind when reflecting on the question of q’s truth. (51)

What does it mean for a person’s belief toward a proposition to fit the person’s evidence? McCain’s answer is a species of ‘explanationism’:

Explanationist Fit (EF): p fits S’s evidence, e, at t iff either p is part of the best explanation available to S at t for why S has e or p is available to S as a logical consequence of the best explanation available to S at t for why S has e. (65)

McCain offers analyses of EF’s key concepts: the best explanation is the most “explanatorily virtuous”, which he says depends on a variety of factors discussed in philosophy of science: “explanatory power, simplicity, scope, and so on” (66); the quality of the best available explanation determines how well p fits S’s evidence (and thus the level of one’s epistemic justification); and the ideas of the best available explanation and the logical consequences thereof are explained in terms of dispositions to have a seeming:

First, at t S has p available as part of the best explanation for why S has e if and only if [a]t t S has the concepts required to understand p and S is disposed to have a seeming that p is part of the best answer to the question “why does S have e?” on the basis of reflection alone. (67)

Second, p is available to S as a logical consequence of the best explanation available to S at t for why S has e if and only if S has the concepts required to understand p and S is disposed on the basis of reflection alone to have a seeming that p is entailed by the best explanation available to S at t for why S has e. (68)

Together these theses yield McCain’s “complete evidentialist account of propositional justification”:


I) Believing p is epistemically justified for S at t if and only if at t S has considered p and:

1) p is part of the best explanation available to S at t for why S has her occurrent non-factive mental states and the non-factive mental states that she is disposed to bring to mind when reflecting on the question of p’s truth


2) p is available to S as a logical consequence of the best explanation available to S at t for why S has her occurrent non-factive mental states and the non-factive mental states that she is disposed to bring to mind when reflecting on the question of p’s truth

II) Withholding judgment concerning p is epistemically justified for S at t if and only if at t S has considered p and neither believing p nor believing ~p is epistemically justified for S. (79)

To explain what an epistemically justified belief is, McCain needs an account of how a belief is based on one’s propositional justification. What does it mean for a belief to be based on the evidence? Rejecting doxastic accounts (which require only a meta-belief that the evidence supports the relevant proposition), McCain argues for a causal account (on which the evidence must cause the person’s belief). McCain’s particular causal account relies on the interventionist theory of causation advanced by James Woodward (2003, 2008). This theory is complicated enough to resist a quick summary, but I will note that McCain’s intuitively successful application of the theory to a wide range of test cases from the literature (including examples of causal deviance, gypsy lawyers, mutually supporting beliefs, swamp creatures, and examples from John Turri (2010) designed to challenge all basing theories) reveals McCain’s basing account to be worthy of serious consideration.

McCain’s completed epistemic theory, which he calls Explanationist Evidentialism, comprises his account of propositional justification (Ex-EJ above) and the interventionist causal account of basing (alluded to above).

I turn now to how McCain’s theory differs from other explanationist views There are multiple ways to distinguish explanationist theories. Here I will mention a few points of difference that will be of interest to mainstream epistemologists. Epistemic justification theories that easily fit the label ‘explanationism’ have included some coherentist theories — such as those advanced by William Lycan (1988), Paul Thagard (2000), and Ted Poston (2014) — as well as hybrids of coherentism and foundationalism advanced by Paul Moser (1989), Susan Haack (1993), and Conee and Feldman (2008). McCain’s Evidentialist Explanationism differs from traditional coherentism in at least one very important respect: whereas traditional coherentists claim that only beliefs can be evidence — a view that faces the objection that one’s beliefs could enjoy a great deal of explanatory coherence but be way out of line with one’s own experiences — McCain’s account (like the hybrids) avoids this ‘input objection’ by allowing mental states other than beliefs (e.g., experiences) as evidence. McCain’s theory is most similar to Moser’s (among hybrids that have been worked out with approximately the same detail). The chief difference concerns when one is justified in believing a proposition entailed by a proposition one is justified in believing. According to Moser (1989), you can be justified in believing q (which is entailed by p) when you are aware of p, you are justified in believing p, you understand q, and p entails q; however, McCain argues by way of examples that this makes propositional justification too easy; his solution is to require a kind of dispositional awareness of the entailment relation among p and q (see ‘Second’ above).

Although McCain takes his Evidentialist Explanationism to fill in the missing details of Conee-Feldman style evidentialism, some of McCain’s details are in tension with (or go beyond) published work by Conee and Feldman. First, although Conee and Feldman have not committed to the claim that the mental states that constitute evidence are representational, McCain has: “The non-factive mental states that psychologism counts as evidence are ones that represent the world as being a certain way” (10-11). Second, McCain denies Feldman’s published view of what it is to have something as available evidence: whereas Feldman (2004) argues that a person has something p available as evidence at t if and only if the person is currently thinking of p, McCain argues that a person also has p as evidence when the person is disposed to bring p to mind when reflecting on the issue about which p is evidentially relevant (see ‘MVP*’ above). Third, whereas Feldman and Conee have left open whether the basing relation is to be understood causally or non-causally, McCain endorses a causal view of basing one’s doxastic attitudes on one’s evidence.

McCain’s argument for Explanationist Evidentialism proceeds in a reflective-equilibrium sort of way. He does not attempt to refute all other theories of epistemic justification or to demonstrate that his theory is true. Nevertheless, by means of examples, appeals to widely shared assumptions, and responses to critics, McCain persuasively shows that his account should be taken seriously as a contender for the correct account of epistemic justification with which he is concerned.

Not everyone will be convinced (e.g., those who demand a strong truth-conduciveness requirement for epistemic justification); and there are several positions McCain takes whose ultimate plausibility depends on tricky metaphysical issues. For instance, McCain’s causal account of basing depends on the interventionist theory of causation, and the plausibility of his claim that evidence consists of representative mental states may depend on whether mental content is conceptual or non-conceptual. There are also a few issues about which sympathetic epistemologists may well like a fuller treatment: for example, why is it that dispositions to have seemings are the best candidates to do the conceptual and causal work McCain intends for them in making for the best explanation available to a person? And, although McCain says that Explanationist Evidentialism is like Haack’s ‘foundherentism’ in that it “seems to lie somewhere between coherentism and foundationalism” (121), how exactly does it respond to the ‘regress argument for foundationalism’?

My only substantive criticism is that the book does not deliver all that McCain tells us up front that it will accomplish. The abstract pledges “a fully developed Evidentialist account of well-founded belief”, and elsewhere we are promised “a complete evidentialist theory of epistemic justification” (79, 117). However, we don’t quite get that because McCain does not specify how the explanatory virtues work in concert to make one explanation better than a competitor. Until we get such a specification, we will lack confidence that some of the examples used to illustrate the theory’s virtues really do follow from the theory. Consider, for example, McCain’s explanation of why Explanationist Evidentialism gets the right (non-skeptical) result while taking skepticism seriously. The context concerns whether a common sense hypothesis or the kind of “improved skeptical hypothesis” developed by Vogel (1990) would be the better explanation available to an ordinary person. McCain lists (i) quantitative parsimony, (ii) qualitative parsimony, (iii) explanatory simplicity, and (iv) unanswerable explanatory questions as being “especially relevant” to which is the better explanation with respect to external world propositions (131). He argues convincingly that a common sense explanation does better with respect to (iii) and (iv), but, due to numerous questions about how we are to understand what makes for (i) and (ii), he says that — with respect to quantitative parsimony and qualitative parsimony — it is not clear that an improved skeptical hypothesis is better than is a common sense hypothesis. His argument is that, for all we know, (i) and (ii) are a wash for our two competing explanations, but, because the common sense explanation does better with respect to explanatory simplicity and unanswerable explanatory questions, it is reasonable to conclude that the common sense explanation is overall better.

This is fine as far as it goes, but should we now rest easy about external-world skepticism? It may be that, given the current state of work on the explanatory virtues, we are not in a position to tell how to measure quantitative and qualitative parsimony when we are considering a common sense scenario versus an improved skeptical scenario, but that just shows that we are not in a position to tell whether Explanationist Evidentialism gets the desired (non-skeptical) result. Nevertheless, we would be mistaken to think that this is a special challenge for Explanationist Evidentialism, for it applies to all explanationist theories.

For reasons that perplex me, Conee-Feldman style evidentialism is routinely misunderstood by critics. McCain’s excellent book therefore performs a great service to epistemologists: it provides not only the most complete Conee-Feldman style evidentialist theory available but also ample motivations for evidentialism in light of a great range of examples and challenges from the literature, all under one cover.


Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard, (1985). “Evidentialism”, Philosophical Studies 48, 15-34.

(2001). “Internalism Defended”, American Philosophical Quarterly 38, 1-18.

(2004). Evidentialism (Oxford University Press).

(2008). “Evidence” in Epistemology: New Essays, ed. Quentin Smith (Oxford University Press) 83-104.

Dougherty, Trent (ed.), (2011). Evidentialism and its Discontents (Oxford University Press).

Feldman, Richard, (2004). “Having Evidence” in Evidentialism, ed. Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (Oxford University Press) 219-241.

Haack, Susan, (1993). Evidence and Inquiry (Blackwell).

Littlejohn, Clayton, (2012). Justification and the Truth-Connection (Cambridge University Press).

Lycan, William, (1988). Judgment and Justification (Cambridge University Press).

Moser, Paul, (1989). Knowledge and Evidence (Cambridge University Press).

Poston, Ted, (2014). Reason and Explanation: A Defense of Explanatory Coherentism (Palgrave-Macmillan).

Thagard, Paul, (2000). Coherence in Thought and Action (MIT Press).

Turri, John, (2010). “On the Relationship between Propositional and Doxastic Justification”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 80, 312-326.

Vogel, Jonathan, (1990). “Cartesian Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation”, The Journal of Philosophy 87, 658-666.

Williamson, Timothy, (2000). Knowledge and Its Limits (Oxford University Press).

Woodward, James, (2003). Making Things Happen (Oxford University Press).

(2008). “Causation and Manipulability”, in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. E.N. Zalta.

1 For evidence, peruse some of the chapters in Dougherty (2011).