Evidentialism and its Discontents

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Trent Dougherty (ed.), Evidentialism and its Discontents, Oxford University Press, 2011, 335pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199563500.

Reviewed by Joseph Shieber, Lafayette College


In the Inquiry, section X, Hume famously notes that the "wise man . . . proportions his belief to the evidence." Fleshing out the insight of this aphorism has been a central project for Earl Conee and Richard Feldman since the publication of their paper "Evidentialism" in 1985.

This collection, edited by Trent Dougherty, is the first dedicated to discussions of Conee and Feldman's brand of evidentialism. It contains a substantial introduction by Dougherty, sixteen essays by noted epistemologists (only three of which include material that had appeared in print previously), replies to the essays by Conee and Feldman, a very handy chart summary of the arguments and Conee and Feldman's replies, and a bibliography of Conee and Feldman's work since the publication in 2004 of their Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology.

In this review, I'll first sketch Conee and Feldman's particular version of evidentialism. Following this, I'll provide some -- regrettably cursory -- comments on a few of the individual essays. Finally, I'll give a summary assessment of the volume.

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Conee and Feldman's version of evidentialism is in fact the conjunction of two claims:

  • EVIDENTIALISM: "Doxastic attitude D toward proposition p is epistemically justified for S at t if and only if having D toward p fits the evidence S has at t" (Conee and Feldman 2004, 83)
  • MENTALISM: "Only mental states can serve as evidence in the relevant sense" (4)

In the first instance, Conee and Feldman's evidentialist mentalism is a theory of propositional justification -- a theory of when a given proposition p is justified for some subject S. Epistemology is also concerned -- if not, indeed, primarily concerned -- with when individual subjects are justified in believing the propositions that they believe. For this reason, it is important to supplement an account of propositional justification with an account of doxastic justification, a property not of propositions but of subjects' beliefs.

Note in particular that, as Conee and Feldman themselves recognize, propositional justification and doxastic justification often come apart. That is, proposition p may be justified for some subject S, despite the fact that S fails to believe that p, or despite the fact that S's belief that p is in fact unjustified -- e.g., because, say, though S has good reasons available to support his belief, he in fact believes on the basis of bad reasons.

For Conee and Feldman it is propositional justification that is basic; doxastic justification -- what they term "well-foundedness" -- is a function of propositional justification. In particular, as Dougherty puts this point, "the formula for doxastic justification is propositional justification plus belief plus proper basing." (11)

With these pieces in place, we are now in a position to assess the sense in which, as Dougherty claims, "for Conee and Feldman . . . internalism is . . . founded upon . . . evidentialism itself." (4) In fact, this is misleading at best. The claim that epistemic justification is a product of evidence is compatible with both epistemological internalism and externalism. To take an extreme example, if an epistemologist is willing to include brute facts among the pieces of evidence for a given proposition, then that epistemologist will be able to embrace both evidentialism and epistemological externalism.

Indeed, it would be more accurate to say that Conee and Feldman's epistemological internalism derives from their adherence to mentalist evidentialism, from their limitation of the sources of justification to mental states. (Although, as noted by Pritchard, in this volume, it is arguably possible to read Timothy Williamson as advocating for a mentalist evidentialist externalism.) For those who associate epistemological internalism with a position that Conee and Feldman term "access internalism," involving the requirement that only states to which a subject has conscious access may serve as justifiers, Conee and Feldman's position offers at least two important contrasts.

First, Conee and Feldman's mentalist evidentialism is neutral with respect to whether subjects are able to access the mental states that figure as evidence for their beliefs. Indeed, Conee and Feldman are open to the very real possibility that there might be mental states that are not accessible consciously. Mentalist evidentialism, however, is open to the possibility that such consciously inaccessible states might still figure in a subject's evidence.

Second, Conee and Feldman's mentalist evidentialism doesn't place any strictures on the precise account of how it is that beliefs fit the evidence. Given this, mentalist evidentialism is compatible with accounts of the fittingness of belief that take advantage of elements of epistemological externalism -- a fact of which both Comesana (2010) and Goldman (this volume) take advantage in presenting a hybrid epistemological position that is intended to capitalize on the strengths of both evidentialism and reliabilism.

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The volume contains a rich selection of papers covering topics including peer disagreement (Michael Huemer, Jonathan Kvanvig, Keith Lehrer), the relation between evidentialism and virtue epistemological approaches (Guy Axtell, Jason Baehr), the relation between evidentialism and responses to skepticism (Matthias Steup, Michael Bergmann), the relation between evidentialism and knowledge (Keith DeRose, Timothy Williamson), the relation of evidentialism to internalism (John Greco, Richard Fumerton), the nature of evidence (Richard Swinburne, Patrick Rysiew, Trent Dougherty), and attempts to synthesize evidentialism with other epistemological positions (Duncan Pritchard, Alvin Goldman).

As with any volume dedicated to the work of a particular philosopher or philosophers, the contributions vary with respect to the extent to which they directly engage with Conee and Feldman's work. Apart from Dougherty's very helpful introduction to Conee and Feldman's version of evidentialism, the contributions dealing most directly with Conee and Feldman's work include those of Axtell, Baehr, Bergmann, DeRose, Greco, Swinburne, Dougherty, Pritchard, and Goldman. Of these contributions, I have space to focus only on some of the themes raised in Dougherty's introduction, as well as the essays by Baehr, Greco, and Goldman.


In addition to brief introductions to each of the thematic sections, Dougherty also provides a very useful introduction to Conee and Feldman's brand of evidentialism. Dougherty begins by limiting his focus to "a brief account of some of the main lines of motivation . . . for evidentialism." (3) Though such a focus is certainly fitting to a volume of this nature, his introduction might have benefitted from the incorporation of a bit more critical distance from the case for evidentialism.

To take one example of this, consider an argument for the centrality of evidence for knowledge that Dougherty terms "The Knowledge and Normativity reductio" (2) -- call this the KN argument:

  1. Suppose for reductio that knowledge does not entail evidential justification.
  2. If 1, then possibly, S knows p though her evidence all points to not-p, even after perfectly virtuous inquiry.
  3. If all S's evidence points to not-p after perfectly virtuous inquiry, then S should believe not-p.
  4. So if 1 -- modulo the seemingly undeniable 3 -- possibly, S knows p though S should believe not-p.

Let us leave aside worries about premise 3 stemming from the fact that even if all of one's evidence after perfectly virtuous inquiry points to not-p, it still might be open to one to withhold belief in not-p, simply because one's total body of evidence still isn't sufficient to compel belief that not-p.

The central problem with the KN argument is that premise 2 is false. Suppose that knowledge does not entail evidential justification. What follows from this is not that it's possible for S to know that p despite the fact that all of her evidence points to not-p, but rather that it's possible that S knows that p despite not having evidential justification for p. This latter possibility, however, involves no more than that S's evidential justification is not sufficient to support the belief that p -- and NOT that S's justification is sufficient to support the belief that not-p. In other words, the strongest conclusion that the KN could in fact support is that it is possible for a subject S to know that p despite the fact that her evidential justification doesn't support believing p. And while this possibility might in fact seem problematic, it is not as obviously problematic as the conclusion to which Dougherty's KN argument points.


Jason Baehr focuses his attention on the sufficiency of evidential support for justification -- i.e., the claim that if one's evidence at t supports p, then one is justified in believing p at t. Baehr uses two sorts of cases to call this sufficiency into question. The first sort involves failures to gather available evidence due to "gullibility, carelessness, or hasty generalization" on the part of the believer. The second sort involves failures fittingly to assess the information one has gathered, due to phenomena like confirmation bias or motivated reasoning. Baehr argues that both of these sorts of cases ought to move the evidentialist to adopt a requirement that, in cases in which a believer's agency makes a salient contribution to the evidence that the believer has gathered regarding the question whether p, then not only must it be the case that her evidence supports p, but it also must be the case that she has functioned, with regard to the contribution of her agency in the gathering and evaluation of evidence, in a manner "consistent with [the employment of] intellectual virtue."

Conee and Feldman dispute Baehr's claim that the second sort of case provides an interesting challenge to evidentialism. For the evidentialist in all cases, including those of motivated reasoning or confirmation bias, what matters is what evidence a believer actually has. If she has countervailing evidence, then, even if she ignores the evidence and thus believes contrary to what the countervailing evidence would suggest, she is unjustified according to the evidentialist -- and the evidentialist has no need to appeal to intellectual virtue to account for the lack of justification in such cases.

Instead, Conee and Feldman focus on the first sort of case, in which intellectual vice results in a subject S's not gathering all of the evidence relevant to the question as to whether p. In their discussion of these sorts of cases, Conee and Feldman suggest that Baehr is mistaken to suggest that such cases demonstrate that there is a sense of "justification", applicable to beliefs, according to which evidential support is insufficient for justification.

Though it is certainly open to Conee and Feldman to insist that the only sort of justification with which they're concerned is one according to which facts about, for example, the way in which a subject gathers evidence are irrelevant to that subject's justification for a given belief, many readers may yet be sympathetic to the worries Baehr raises on this point for evidentialism.

To see this, consider that Conee and Feldman's response to Baehr makes it plain that it is entirely consistent with their view for there to be subjects S satisfying the following three conditions:

  1. S is justified in believing that p.
  2. S should have gotten herself different evidence.
  3. If S had gotten herself different evidence, then S would not be justified in believing that p.

Although it is clearly possible to defend a view according to which there may be subjects satisfying 1 - 3, I join Baehr in finding the compatibility of Conee and Feldman's view with the possibility of such cases to be unpalatable. Indeed, if one recalls Dougherty's reductio argument KN discussed in the section on Dougherty above, this possibility seems particularly damning for Conee and Feldman. (For another commentary in this volume that expresses skepticism about the possibility of subjects' satisfying 1 - 3, cf. DeRose's discussion of Feldman's notion of the epistemic "ought." A classic account of justification that would seem directly at odds with the possibility of the sorts of cases represented by 1 - 3 may be found in Goldman's base-clause principle #10 in Goldman 1992, p. 123)


Greco raises a few separate points in criticism of Conee and Feldman's evidentialism, but I'll focus here on only one of Greco's arguments. He notes that contemporary cognitive science suggests that many paradigm cases of knowledge involve information processing at levels below person-level representational states. As Greco further points out, what will be involved in knowledge in such cases will depend on contingent facts about human cognition. If this is the case, then to the extent that the concept of justification is intended to capture what is added to true belief to get knowledge (leaving aside Gettier cases), then these facts about the ways in which what is involved in paradigm cases of knowledge is hostage to empirical inquiry stand in tension with evidentialism, according to which justification depends solely on evidence and evidential relations are a priori determinable.

Conee and Feldman don't address Greco's more general point about the tension between evidentialism and the contingency of human cognitive faculties. In response to Greco's suggestion that many paradigm cases of knowledge involve information processing that doesn't involve person-level representational states -- and thus doesn't involve evidence -- Conee and Feldman simply reject this claim, suggesting that in each of the examples to which Greco alludes (memory, a priori knowledge via reflection, blindsight) evidence always accompanies justification.

One problem to which Conee and Feldman's rejection of Greco's claim points is that their rejection seems to reveal a striking lack of sensitivity to the contingency of facts about human cognitive systems. Thus, e.g., they write "a vivid sense of recalling some fact seems to us clearly to be some evidence for the belief, and less vivid senses of recalling are weaker evidence. Furthermore, memories are usually accompanied by corroborating factual recollections or recollective imagery." (286)

As research into flashbulb memories suggests, however, "a vivid sense of recalling" is not always positively correlated with memorial accuracy. (Cf. Talarico and Rubin 2003) Furthermore, both accurate and inaccurate memories are generally accompanied by corroborating recollections and imagery, although at least some studies have suggested a correlation between the level of detail of corroboration or the vividness of memorial imagery and the accuracy of the memory. (Cf. Koriat et al. 2000)

The point here is that it would seem that there is no necessary evidential relation between the qualities of memorial experiences and the beliefs supported by those experiences. If this is the case, however, then it is not simply a matter of intuition -- whether C and J's or anyone else's -- as to what sorts of memorial experiences will serve as evidence for a given belief, or indeed if any of the sorts of states that C and J classify as evidence are present in actual cases of human remembering. This would suggest that Greco's arguments from cognitive psychology cannot be dismissed as quickly by means of a simple appeal to armchair intuition as Conee and Feldman would seem to assume.


Goldman's goal is to demonstrate how various problems faced by evidentialism could be mitigated if evidentialism were supplemented with reliabilist components. Given space limitations, it would be impossible to deal adequately with all of the points raised by Goldman's discussion. Instead, I would like to focus briefly on a rather single self-contained argument of Goldman's, one that resonates nicely with the discussions in Baehr and DeRose about the insufficiency of evidence for justification.

Goldman considers a case in which two believers, each possessing the same body of evidence E, assign a probability of 0.45 to some proposition p. Suppose that one of the believers, Shirley, assigns a probability of 0.45 to p simply on the basis of a wild guess. Suppose that the other believer, Madeleine, an extremely proficient confirmation theorist, assigns a probability of 0.45 to p only after determining -- using "her accurate, well-honed skills at determining degrees of support" -- that the degree of confirmation that E confers on p is 0.45. Goldman suggests that the fact that there is a difference in the justification of Shirley and Madeleine motivates the adoption of a two-component theory of epistemic justification: one component, an evidential component, would recognize the fact that both Shirley and Madeleine possess the same body of evidence, while the other component, a process component, would account for the difference between Shirley and Madeleine with respect to the way that they arrive at their belief given their evidence.

Goldman notes that Conee and Feldman discuss a similar case, one in which

a person may know some propositions that logically entail some proposition that the person . . . surely does not know to follow from the things she does know. The logical route from what she knows to this proposition may be complex and go beyond her understanding, or even the understanding of any person. In our view, the person is not then justified in believing the consequence, even though it is entailed by her evidence. (Conee and Feldman 2008, 94)

There, the solution Conee and Feldman seem to endorse is that "to become justified in believing the proposition, she has to learn something new -- namely, its logical connection to her evidence." In response to this solution, Goldman presses two worries.

The first is that it seems excessive to require knowledge of logical (or, in the case of Goldman's example, probabilistic) connections for justified belief. It is not, in general, true that people need explicitly to master the principles governing logical or probabilistic support relations in order to become justified in believing on the basis of logical or probabilistic support.

The second worry is that the mere mastery of principles, to the extent that such mastery is understood as knowledge of additional propositions of logic or probability theory, will not solve the problem presented here. The problem is an old one, the one pointed out by Lewis Carroll in his "What the Tortoise Said to Achilles." (Carroll 1895) As Goldman puts this point, "unless the subject applies appropriate processes, or operations, to the newly learned principles to form a belief . . .  he will still fail to have a justified belief." (265)

It is a shame that Conee and Feldman do not address this argument of Goldman's in their reply to Goldman in this volume. Perhaps their assumption in not addressing this argument was that, once an adequate account of the basing relation is available, worries like the one raised by Goldman will no longer have bite. Still, it would have been valuable to hear more on this point from them.

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Unfortunately, despite the uniformly high quality of the contributions, the volume would have been well-served in places by a stronger editorial hand. There are at least a few passages in the contributions where stronger editing would have aided the reader in navigating the arguments. To cite perhaps the most obvious example, in Williamson's essay, one reads, "But how much weaker can one's epistemic position be with respect to the fact that one knows that p than it is with respect to the fact that one knows that p." (147) Since Williamson is concerned with the distinction between knowing that p and knowing that one knows that p, this sort of mistake, though understandable, regrettably detracts from the reader's ability to process the -- already often quite dense -- material.

Furthermore, the organization of the volume provides an additional unnecessary hurdle for the reader. As I noted above, the volume includes -- in addition to the sixteen contributors' essays -- replies by Conee and Feldman and a chart summary of the contributors' main arguments along with Conee and Feldman's responses. Regrettably, the organization of the essays is mirrored neither in the organization of Conee and Feldman's responses nor in the organization of the chart summary of the arguments. Furthermore, while the chart summary is organized alphabetically by contributor name, Conee and Feldman's replies are organized by some other method. This makes consulting the replies in conjunction with the contributors' essays needlessly burdensome.

Despite these -- admittedly rather minor -- weaknesses, this volume represents a significant contribution to a number of ongoing discussions in contemporary epistemology. It will be useful for both graduate students and researchers in epistemology, and a valuable addition to library collections in epistemology.


Carroll, Lewis. 1895. "What the Tortoise Said to Achilles" Mind 4:14, 278-280.

Comesana, Juan. 2010. "Evidentialist Reliabilism." Nous 44:4, 571-600.

Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard. 2004. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.

Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard. 2008. "Evidence." In Quentin Smith, ed. Epistemology: New Essays. New York: Oxford University Press, 83-104.

Goldman, Alvin. 1992. Liaisons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Koriat, A., Goldsmith, M. and Pansky, A. 2000. "Toward a Psychology of Memory Accuracy." Annual Review of Psychology. 51:481-537.

Talarico, J. M. and Rubin, D. C. 2003. "Confidence, not consistency, characterizes flashbulb memories". Psychological Science 14:5, 455-461.