Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology

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Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard, Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology, Oxford University Press, New York, 2004, 336pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199253730.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


In Evidentialism, Conee and Feldman admirably and effectively defend a traditional epistemological view they call evidentialism from its externalist critics. They also take dead aim at externalism itself, claiming that its most well-known versions face insuperable difficulties. The book is a collection of papers, some by Conee, some by Feldman, and some co-authored. Two of the papers have not been previously published, and there are afterwords added to five of the previously published papers. To describe the book as a mere collection of papers would be misleading, however. The papers are remarkably cohesive, focusing on common issues that lie at the heart of epistemology. To my way of thinking, the papers are also a model of philosophical writing. They are exceptionally clear, precise, and well-argued. One is never left wondering what the argument or view under consideration is.

The evidentialism defended throughout the book is a version of internalism. The initial characterization of evidentialism as the view that the epistemic status of a belief depends entirely on the evidence possessed by the believer strikes me as potentially misleading in that it might suggest to some that the "evidence" in question is restricted to something propositional. Conee and Feldman make clear, however, that on their view evidence can consist of non-doxastic internal states. Furthermore, externalists have their own way of understanding evidence "externally," and with that externalist understanding of evidence these externalists can pay lip service to the Conee/Feldman view that nothing but one's "evidence" is relevant to the epistemic status of one's belief. But Conee and Feldman make it clear that the evidence upon which they think all justified beliefs depends consists only of internal features of the believer exemplified at the time the beliefs are held. The defining feature of their internalist evidentialism is their commitment to the view that it is impossible for there to be a time at which two people are in the same internal mental states while one has justification at that time for believing a proposition p and the other does not.

It is characteristic of philosophers that we tend not to spend all that much time indicating our agreement with others. In that tradition, I shall focus on the concerns I have with recurring themes in Conee and Feldman's arguments and views. I should stress at the outset, however, that there are many more points on which we agree than on which we disagree. Their paper "The Generality Problem for Reliabilism" is, for example, a seminal work exposing one of the most difficult problems facing the reliabilist. The problem as I see it is not so much the task of specifying which among the possible causal processes producing a belief is active. At most, that is an epistemological problem. After all, if a generality theory of causation is correct, there is in nature a distinction between the causally relevant properties of an "input" and the causally relevant properties of its "output". The problem arises, however, in the characterization of the relevant circumstances/environment relative to which the critical reliability is defined. So, for example, there may be a fact of the matter as to how perceptual beliefs get formed, but one's environment can affect the reliability of the process. The very same process that is reliable in one environment (broad daylight) might be decidedly unreliable in another environment (dusk), and the reliabilist needs to do a great deal of work in generating plausible criteria for how to relativize the relevant reliability to a kind of environment. There are also problems related to the fact that different but indiscriminable belief-forming processes may be operating side by side. For example, there may be a causal process of remembering that is reliable in both old and young, while in the old, "random" beliefs about the past "pop" into mind along side of the reliably produced beliefs, and in ways phenomenologically indistinguishable from them. It's hard to see how the reliabilist can allow that the older person who suffers this malady has justified beliefs about the past even when such beliefs are produced by the reliable process.

In discussing points of disagreement I have with Conee and Feldman, I shall focus mainly on material presented in three papers: Conee's "First Things First," and the co-authored papers, "Defending Internalism" and "Making Sense of Skepticism." In the last of these papers, Conee and Feldman begin by arguing that a flaw in externalism is its inability to accommodate the obvious force that appeal to skeptical possibilities should strike an epistemologist as having. Their argument is a bit delicate, since they also want to argue that a plausible version of internalism will eventually be able to thwart the skeptic and respond to various arguments that trade on the intelligibility of skeptical scenarios. In effect, they want to argue that while internalists can respond to the threat posed by skeptical scenarios, externalists are not even positioned to feel the threat.

While I'm sympathetic to this general line of argument, I worry that Conee and Feldman's own version of internalism falls prey to the same problem. Suppose, for example, that a skeptic is trying to cause trouble by pointing out that that the qualitatively same sensations that occur in veridical experience could also occur in the context of a skeptical scenario. Reliabilists, causal theorists, and tracking theorists, can all respond that this conceptual possibility is quite irrelevant to the justificatory status of an actual belief, for its epistemic status depends on contingent facts about the genesis of the belief in the actual world. As long as we inhabit the kind of world in which perceptual beliefs are reliably formed, caused by their truth-makers, or tracking the relevant facts in the relevant way, everything is fine. But it seems to Conee and Feldman (and to me), that one simply cannot ignore the relevance of the skeptical possibilities so easily.

Although I think their conclusion is correct, I am not sure they identify the real source of the worry. As I have argued elsewhere, it seems to me that the real problem with externalist accounts of knowledge and justification is that one can obviously satisfy externalist conditions for knowledge and justification without gaining the slightest assurance, from the first-person perspective, that one's beliefs are true. Having a reliably produced belief without having any way of discovering that it is reliably produced does nothing for the person who has seen The Matrix one too many times and is beginning to worry about the nature of the external reality causally responsible for his experiences. But Conee and Feldman specifically reject (in a number of papers) the view that I call inferential internalism. While they insist that the justificatory status of a belief depends on nothing other than the internal states of the believer, they reject the view that to be justified in believing P on the basis of evidence E one must have epistemic reason to believe that E does make probable P. As a result, they allow that one's evidential states can make probable that, say, there is a table in front of one (P), and, through known entailment, can make probable the falsehood of all skeptical scenarios, even when one hasn't a clue as to just how the evidential states do make probable P. I'm not sure how being in such a situation is any better that being a person with a reliably produced belief that P, or being a person with a belief caused by the fact that P.

There is, of course, a difference between the two views. As I understand Conee and Feldman's version of internalism, if it is true that S's having "internal" evidence E would justify S in believing P, that truth is necessary. It is not just that in this world two believers are never in the same internal states while differing in the epistemic status of their beliefs. Rather, on their view, if S's internal states justify S in believing P in this world, such states would justify S in believing P in all possible worlds. Since this is true, it seems to me that they are committed to something like the Keynesian view of epistemic probability as an internal relation holding between evidence and that for which it is evidence. Such truths are presumably knowable a priori. But as any student struggling with a final exam in logic can tell you, being knowable a priori and knowing are two completely different matters, and knowability without knowledge is irrelevant to assurance.

It might help to put the point in a slightly different way. While trying to show that internalism has the resources to thwart the skeptic, Conee and Feldman point out, plausibly enough, that the fact that a skeptical hypothesis is logically compatible with one's basic evidence for believing a proposition of commonsense does not constitute a defeater for one's justification for believing that proposition. But in the last few pages of "Making Sense of Skepticism" the authors seem to me to admit that they haven't got a satisfactory account of how the occurrence of sensation does in fact make probable truths about the physical world. The question then becomes whether the following proposition is a defeater for my justification for believing that P: I haven't got the faintest idea how my putative evidence bears on the likelihood of P. If a fellow juror, for example, argues for the guilt of a defendant while admitting that he hasn't any idea how the evidence makes plausible the guilt, I'm more than a bit puzzled by the claim.

In general, I worry that Conee and Feldman (and many of my fellow internalists) are too willing to relax standards for justification in order to meet one kind of argument that Goldman puts forth in "Internalism Exposed." Goldman argues that the internalist simply has not the resources to avoid unpalatable skepticism. Among other charges leveled at internalism, Goldman claims that much of what we commonsensically claim to know survives only as what amounts to "stored" knowledge. I know that the Battle of Hastings took place in 1066, but I cannot for the life of me remember when or how I learned that fact. The belief counts as knowledge only in virtue of its causal origin, according to Goldman. Searching for present mental states that justify my belief, Conee and Feldman suggest that the internalist might appeal to various stored dispositional mental states that would do the present job of justifying the relevant belief. But they are not very specific about just what these stored mental states might be or how they would do their epistemic work. In "First Things First" Conee indicates some sympathy for a view he calls seeming evidentialism. On this view, "our evidence about the epistemic is how epistemic things seem to be" (p. 19). As I understand the view, the mere fact that the proposition that E is evidence for P strikes one (in a certain phenomenologically distinct way) as true makes prima facie plausible the truth of the proposition. Parity of reasoning suggests, then, that the mere fact that any proposition strikes one as true in this way is a prima facie reason for believing the proposition. This "seeming to be true" is not just any old belief in the proposition—it is instead a certain way that the proposition seems "compelling." The view obviously bears at least a resemblance to epistemic conservatism—the view that the fact that I believe P gives P initial epistemic credibility, but again Conee would emphasize that seeming to be true is more than believing.

Obviously, both epistemic conservatism and seeming evidentialism would be a boon to the internalist seeking internal reasons to believe the propositions of commonsense. Arguably, propositions gain their status as propositions of commonsense precisely because it seems to most people that they are true. And if one can store these "seemings" as dispositional intentional states, they might do wonders for the philosopher seeking to respond to Goldman's claim that the internalist hasn't enough resources to justify the beliefs of commonsense. One might initially have formed a belief in response to fairly complex body of evidence, where the proposition believed is now stored not just as belief, but as a belief in a proposition that seems to be true. Its seeming to be true now might be all that is necessary to get the proposition prima facie epistemic plausibility. But one wonders if this internalist isn't making it simply too easy to defeat the skeptic—one worries that this evidence comes without honest epistemic toil.

There is an interesting analogue of seeming evidentialism that strikes me as a bit more plausible (though the difficulty of avoiding skepticism is also greater). If there is this phenomenologically distinct state that Conee calls seeming to be true, one might retain an inductively justified belief that this state correlates rather well with the truth of what seems to be true. Of course, for the present internal state evidentialist, one would still need something present (presumably dispositional seemings to remember) that could do the job of establishing the past correlations between a proposition's seeming to be true and its being true. It should also be obvious that such track-record arguments might be available for some of us and not others. Needless to say, all of the philosophical positions that seemed to me to be true turned out to be true, but since most other philosophers reject my philosophical conclusions, such track-record arguments are presumably not available to them! On any such approach, one would still need to be able to reasonably rely on apparent memory, and the problem for an internalist trying to discover a non-circular vindication of apparent memory as a source of information about the past is more than a bit intimidating.

Internalists and externalists alike cannot afford to ignore the work of Conee and Feldman in this outstanding collection. They represent a powerful voice in the defense of an important epistemological tradition.