Evil and Moral Psychology

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Peter Brian Barry, Evil and Moral Psychology, Routledge, 2012, 208pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415532907.

Reviewed by Adam Morton, University of Alberta


Issues about evil and atrocity have an obvious connection with everyday moral attitudes. They have also become a terrain contested by rival views about the nature of the moral. Some of these views are hard to state clearly, hence the appeal of a proxy contest over issues of obvious resonance. Two such contests concern the relative importance of evaluations of character and evaluations of acts, and whether moral considerations are basic or derived. I sense disagreements about these beneath my reactions to the intuitions and arguments in Barry's well-argued and carefully thought out defence of his central claim. This claim is that moral philosophy and moral psychology should take account of the likely existence of people with distinctive evil characters. I say "likely existence" because Barry defends a very demanding thesis about evil character, according to which a person is evil only when there is no possible world in which they have a counterpart who is "a morally worse sort of person" (p. 16). This is not meant as a definition but as a claim to be defended. At first sight it seems to relegate evil people to fantasy, since surely any monster could have committed one more atrocity. The book can be read as an explanation of why on his conception of evil character this does not follow.

Barry considers a number of possible defining characteristics of evil character, searching always for a profile that is instantiated among real human beings and is intuitively as bad as we can get. He wants to avoid making any particular vice essential, because the link between evil character and atrocity is then threatened by the enormous variety of reasons for which people can do awful things. In fact the book is distinguished, I think, by being one of the few defences of robust evil character that do not fall into empirically dubious claims of a unity to the reasons for atrocity. His final formulation is that an evil person is one who "should have known better, who is willing to do autonomously what decent people would not, and who lacks the feelings possessed by barely decent people" (p. 87). It is clear from the more detailed exposition that the evil person's motivation is systematically flawed, not just that they should have known better on some specific occasion. Note the appeal to decency. Evil people are for Barry rare and extreme limiting cases, who occupy a special place in the scale of badness on which we are all located. Decent people are -- though I don't think there's a definition in the book -- people who possess a normal supply of virtues. Moral virtues are structured multi-track dispositions to do particular kinds of actions for particular kinds of motives with particular kinds of feelings. Moral vices are sometimes discussed as if they were similar dispositions but with inverted kinds of actions and motives. But Barry's official view is that vices are lacks of virtue. The reason is, again, that otherwise we implausibly limit the range of motives for evil.

The defence of the claim that evil characters are maximally awful can now be completed. Remember that the theory centers on an account of evil character, and not of evil action or motive. As a result "the fact that someone is a bit more motivated to be mean or unkind or deceitful does not necessarily make any difference to the overall moral quality of her character" (p. 71). Counterparts of some standard examples of morally awful people could have produced additional horrors while being, morally speaking, the same sorts of people. This will require some sort of correlation between the vices, according to which a person is unlikely to have most but not all of them. Consider a genocidal sadist who does not show carelessness with important matters or neglect of his friends. He has his versions of the virtues of responsibility and concern. He will not qualify as evil, since his character could become even worse. (I take it that it is irrelevant whether there could be worse people; the relevant question asks of a particular evil person whether he could have been worse.) The important question is not whether his versions of the virtues are really virtues, even in a very diminished way, but whether they represent patterns of motivation, feeling, and action with respect to which he as a person could stray, or could have strayed, even further from decency. Could that person have been worse?

Barry's characterization of evil personality could be correct even if it does not follow from it that evil people have maximally bad characters. The theory would contrast less starkly with the alternatives, though. The starkest alternative is what Phillip Cole has called "eliminativism" (Cole 2006), the view that the concept of evil is a harmful one that we would be better off without. One less drastic alternative tries to distinguish aspects of wrongdoing that are characteristically evil from those that are in other ways wrong, even if very wrong (Morton 2004.) Another alternative approach focuses on evil actions and motives rather than on evil character (Card 2002). Obviously these two last alternatives can combine, though they do not have to. On none of these alternatives is there anything resembling the demonic image of the evil person of folk moral psychology. (And which is still powerful in American opinion, as suggested by experimental philosophy results cited by Barry.) But the claim to significance of Barry's definition of evil character is that it does support an intellectualized, non-demonic, version of the popular image of the evil-doer, a version that is respectable but sufficiently similar to link to widespread intuitions about motivation and blame. Without the maximality consequence that link is lost, and we can ask why we should use this particular definition, bringing together this particular bundle of considerations.

One tension within the popular concept of an evil person concerns responsibility. The evil person of popular imagination is at the same time like a wolf or a shark, a force of nature bound to the destruction of prey, and like an ingenious opponent, calculating the most ingenious means to the most awful end. (The devil is inscrutable but the devil is also smart.) It's hard to combine these: we don't hold sharks responsible for eating people but we do hold calculating human opponents responsible for the outcomes of their machinations. Further, there is the puzzling loose consideration that when the act is awful enough the perpetrators couldn't have been motivated the way people normally are, so that we should hesitate to blame them.

Barry engages with these issues by showing that his definition allows evil agents to have motivational processes like enough to those of normal agents that responsibility can arise. The opposite is consistent with the definition too: some evil agents may be sharks. At the end of the book he discusses aggravating factors that, in the laws of US states, can be part of an argument for capital punishment. (I would have a hard time proving it, but I cannot avoid the suspicion that many of the reactions to cases discussed here are from a culturally rather narrow range, more likely in individuals from a particular background than in a wide range of times and places. Still, that range includes most likely readers of the book.) It is useful to have these factors brought together, and to see how varied, disorganized, and quirky they are. The issue is important because it is one of the places where a concept in the evil family does some work in moral and legal thinking. A fundamental complication, though, is that aggravation is more subtle than evil personality. Few of the people who, it might be argued, should be executed for aggravating factors are evil in Barry's sense, and there can be aggravating factors in the blame for trivial misdeeds such as missing appointments. There is interesting further work to do here on the relation between attributions of character and aggravating and excusing factors for particular acts.

I said at the beginning of this review that debates about evil are a ground for making explicit and beginning the discussion of large issues that are hard to depict with a fine brush. Reading Evil and Moral Psychology one feels the lurking presence of large and difficult questions. There are issues about the unity of morality (how does "decent" relate to "bad"), about the relation of assessment of character to evaluations of action (how does "that was a terrible thing to do" relate to "she's an awful person"?), and issues about the supervenience or not of morality on other facts (how does "that's evil" relate to "we have overwhelming reason to discourage that"?) On all of these I expect that Barry and I are inclined to different opinions, and that he is probably more in accord with popular sentiment than I am. (Still, sometimes an idea does not come to be doubted until someone tries to defend it.) For me this is one reason to welcome this book, as a clearly argued, sensible, and scientifically literate defence of the idea that there is such a thing as evil personality.


Card, Claudia 2002. The Atrocity Paradigm. New York: Oxford University Press.

Cole, Phillip 2006. The Myth of Evil. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.

Morton, Adam 2004. On Evil. London: Routledge.