Evil in Aristotle

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Pavlos Kontos (ed.), Evil in Aristotle, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 277pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107161979.

Reviewed by Sophia M. Connell, Birkbeck, University of London


In Aristotle's philosophy, there is no source or principle of evil as there is of good (Metaphysics IX.9, 1051a19-21). Badness does not exist in the category of substance, whereas the supreme god is existence par excellence. Furthermore, there is no contrary to this 'primary being' (Metaphysics XII.10, 1075b20-24). How then, does evil get a foothold? Extreme badness is for Aristotle not something substantial or a source or principle in its own right but rather the absence or privation of good.

This collection constitutes the first focused treatment of Aristotle on evil. In the past, most have assumed that since he has neither an evil intelligence, like Satan, nor a source of everything bad, such as Plato's receptacle, there is no theory of evil in Aristotle. A claim the book wishes to 'defend' is 'that Aristotle has a theory of evil that is both highly elaborate and attractive' (p.1). The volume certainly shows how much scope there is in Aristotle's writings to map out his various explanations of bad things. The further claim that there is something like a 'theory of evil' in Aristotle is more tenuous and is not in fact explored in most of the essays. Instead, there are different ways of thinking about 'evil' in many areas of Aristotle's thought, as the introduction hints at by going through the different meanings of the Greek term ta kaka (bad or evil things) within a single Greek tragedy. And thus, it is not so much that there is one theory of evil, but rather that, for Aristotle, there are almost as many ways to talk of badness as of goodness ('The good is said in many ways'; Nicomachean Ethics 1.6, 1096a23). And this is hardly surprising, since it is the good or the good goal that frames and organises Aristotle's analysis in most of his areas of interest, in particular his metaphysics and cosmology, his biology and zoology, his ethics and his political philosophy, including his theories of government, legislation and education (and also his rhetorical and literary theories, which are not discussed here).

Two of the most promising areas to locate some kind of extreme badness that might count as 'evil' in Aristotelian thought would be in metaphysics (the source or cause of all badness in the world, something that later Platonists and Christians worried about identifying) and his ethics and politics (the absolute worst individual and city). The first topic appears in the first essay -- and those towards the end (chs. 9-10) where later thinkers attempt to integrate Aristotle's ontological categories with their more robust accounts of the nature of evil The second type of 'evil', moral and political, understandably receives much more attention in the book. The loci critici are portions of the Nicomachean Ethics VII on deviant characters and the Politics V on deviant city-states (chs. 4-8, 11-12). There is also one essay on bad outcomes in Aristotle's natural philosophy (ch. 3). The natural world displays a clear falling off from perfection, not only due to perishability of natural kinds, but also their less than perfect natures. This topic merits much more space than the single chapter provided, as it grounds accounts of moral and political evils. After all, human being is a natural kind that is subject to change, degradation, variation and defects, all of which manifest themselves in the ethical and political realms.

I will focus on these three subject areas in turn: metaphysics, ethics/politics, natural philosophy (although they do not appear in this order in the book) and end with a few notes on two chapters 2 and 12).

In 'Good and Bad in Aristotle', C.D.C. Reeve launches straight into complicated and difficult analyses of a variety of texts, providing the most comprehensive treatment of the metaphysics of the bad in Aristotle. He begins by setting out Aristotle's god and establishing that it has no opposite. Badness, then, is a privation of good -- and not a thinking being like Satan. In the latter portion of the essay, an eventual focus on vice (in opposition to virtue) gives the reader a key connection to a modern understanding of the term evil. Reeve sees the impossibility of a metaphysical place for badness in Aristotle to be a recognition by him that 'ethical badness or evil' is to be treated as a 'psycho-political' problem rather than an ontological one (p.30). As he so astutely points out, vice is a failure of an individual to be virtuous and the causes of it rest either in the society or in the individual, perhaps due to a natural defect (p.26). Using an extended thought experiment in which a community aims at consumerist pleasures, Reeve also emphasises that badness is fundamentally inconsistent, ultimately undermining human well-being (p.29).

In 'Plotinus Against Aristotle on the Problem of Evil' (ch. 9) Paul Kalligas gives an elegant account of Plotinus on evil, placing it into the context of debates within Neoplatonist and Christian commentators. For Plotinus matter is the ultimate source of evil -- when our souls become embodied, matter creates illusory reflections of real forms. Evil in the soul comes from this source, which is necessary but not sufficient for the turning away of the soul from its true nature -- a wilful forgetfulness must also be involved. This ultimately determines whether we 'will subject ourselves to the impressions derived from the body' (p.203). Kalligas ends by tracing the Aristotelian aspects of Plotinian attempts to explain the ontology of evil.

Kevin L. Flannery, S.J. ('Being Bad: Aristotelian Resonances in Aquinas' Conception of Evil') turns to later Christian philosophy, showing how Aquinas used Aristotelian thinking in coming up with a coherent account of evil. In thinking of evil as privation, Aquinas sees himself following Aristotle. He then adapts Aristotelian ontological categories in order to make sense of good and evil as two species in human actions (as opposed to evil in the natural world which is a privation within the same genera). Thus, Aquinas can be seen to 'make direct use of quite a number of Aristotelian ideas'.

Turning now to more overtly ethical and political themes, Pavlos Kontos' 'Radical Evil in Aristotle's Ethics and Politics' argues for a theory of 'radical evil' in Aristotle. In describing bad character types (Nicomachean Ethics VII), Aristotle gives us two: the vicious person and the bestial one (thêrion). These appear to map onto two types of opposition: contraries, which fall on opposite ends of the same scale, and privative and positive. Vice is the contrary of virtue; beastliness a privation of the human capacity for virtue or vice. Radical, for Kontos, means 'outside the limits of vice' (Nicomachean Ethics VII.5, 1148b34-49a1), because the basis of morality is absent or destroyed: the bestial person has no capacity for practical reason and deliberative choice. It is also posited that, in parallel, Aristotle's extremely deviant constitutions do not count as constitutions because their lawlessness means the basis of sound government is undermined or destroyed (p.86). Kontos connects these extremes to unnaturalness -- radical evil is 'contrary to nature' because it causes human nature or the form of human communities to degenerate completely. This privative model explains why there is no wish for evil -- a focus on the wrong sorts of desire and lifestyle lead to such degeneration, without it ever being a goal for the individual or community -- in fact, it could not be a goal, since it results in self-destruction (p.93). The cure for individuals is expulsion and for communities, the rejuvenation of political virtues within the population. For Kontos, beastliness (thêriotês) 'does not necessarily imply insanity', noting the tyrant Phalaris (p.77). What these people lack is any sense of good or bad, and thus any capacity to reason on the basis of values. Radical evil, then, is unnatural incurable amorality but not insanity; thus, it is perhaps a natural human defect that falls in some sense within the domain of nature (see Stasinos Stravrineas' analysis below).

In 'Aristotle on Psychopathology', Giles Pearson posits that Aristotle had 'an early, and fairly sophisticated, sketch of psychopathology' (p.122). Preferring to translate thêriotês as brutish, he focuses on the causes of this extreme personality, according to Aristotle -- nature, disease and habit (VII.5, 1148b15-18). The bestial (or brutish) state of character is perhaps the closest we get in Aristotle to pure human evil, resulting in behaviours such as murder, cannibalism and rape (VII.5, 1148b18-31). However, one might wonder if members of this rare group are actually evil or rather merely sick, and their defect, however it is caused, isn't part of the moral realm. This is presumably why Aristotle says it is not as bad as vice (1150a1); it is not something that deserves our censure, and is thereby also incurable. Pearson, however, carves out space for moral censure and therapy for psychopathology, but only in certain cases. For Pearson, in contrast to Kontos, the fully bestial character lacks all reasoning capability. Human reasoning for Aristotle has two aspects: knowing the good or fine and instrumental reasoning about how to reach this end. Kontos argues that, like many intelligent non-human animals, the bestial person will possess instrumental reasoning. Pearson, on the other hand, thinks that since the bestial person is 'living by his senses alone' (VII.5, 1149a10), he or she lacks any reasoning capability. For Pearson, these people are utterly inhuman and so irredeemable. However, in addition to these lost causes, there are those that retain the capacity to reason but have bestial or brutish urges, and are capable of intermittent brutish actions, on the model of akrasia. Such people are also (perhaps also intermittently) aware of their bestial impulses and actions, and so are both responsible and curable. They are responsible for working towards ridding themselves of these impulses through habituation to the correct actions (pp.147-8).

The presence in many 'evil' individuals of inner conflict or turmoil (and thus a capacity to reform) is reinforced by Stephen Engstrom's analysis (in 'Virtue and Vice in Aristotle and Kant') which nicely points out that there is conflict in the vicious person for Aristotle; this is then easier to line up with Kant's idea of vice as a sort of self-deceiving act of the will. Engstrom also argues that Kant allows for the ideal good person to be unconflicted. Thus, Aristotle and Kant's accounts of virtue and vice are not as far away from each other as is often depicted. Another schematic account of Aristotelian moral failings and vices appears in Howard J. Curzer's 'Aristotelian Demons' which makes important links to related failings in interpersonal relationships (or friendships). Connections to the theme of evil are made by using the labels 'hell' and 'demons' for the worst cities and characters we find in Aristotelian ethics and politics.

Marta Jimenez's 'Aristotle on Enduring Evils While Staying Happy' details how Aristotle allows for bad fortune to affect our chances of achieving the good life, although she ultimately concludes that the virtuous person can triumph even in extreme circumstances. The extent to which these obstacles to the good life count as 'evils' depends upon their origins; certainly if these are the bad intentions of others, this would seem to count as evil. According to Jimenez's optimist view, the world does not resist our attempts to flourish.

A more pessimistic account comes from a close analysis of Aristotle's political philosophy by Richard Kraut ('The Political Kakon: The Lowest Forms of Constitutions'). Kraut expertly develops the thought that human beings can go 'astray' at two levels, an individual and a collective one. The goal of political science is the improvement of legislation and constitutions, which aim for human well-being, as explained in the Nicomachean Ethics and further developed in the Politics. However, most constitutions are incorrect, which means that 'most adult human being have been so badly educated that they are unreachable through rational argument' (p.173). Even without that impediment, Kraut finds in Aristotle the thought that 'the forces that make human beings bad are . . . strong'. In a fascinating and illuminating account of Aristotle's advocacy for the rule of 'people in the middle', Kraut explains how being too rich and too poor severely impairs the moral development of individuals, leading to political turmoil in most communities. Although Kraut concedes that people have a natural push toward virtue, he concludes that there is also a strong urge toward tyranny, particularly manifest in the drive toward extreme aggression (sexual and otherwise). This is an intriguing thought, that tyranny is due not only to bad upbringing but must exist on some level within the individual. This would depend, however, on whether the tyrant was vicious or amoral (i.e. somewhere in the region of pathological beastliness). For Aristotle, in contrast to Plato in Rep. IX, the tyrant is vicious, a capacity then that exists in any human being, as the counterpoint of the capacity for virtue. This account of individuals seems plausible, but one might worry that Aristotle's pessimism about structure of city-states is overstated. If humans naturally form themselves into cities (Politics I.2), according to Aristotle, then more explanation is required for his belief that they almost always fail.

One final aspect of evil in Aristotle is mistakes or defects in nature. What causes such mistakes if nature does nothing in vain but always works for the best? Stravrianeas' 'The Good, the Bad, and the Ugly: Natural Teleology and its Failures in Aristotle' attempts to account for numerous failures in perfection in the natural world, from animal kinds that are less good at generation or locomotion, to monstrosities and deformities. The chapter begins with a focus on 'deformed' natural kinds, those animals whose usual bodily structure and way of life are in some sense 'defective' -- i.e. in comparison with those types of animal that are better or more noble. This 'evaluative language' helps Aristotle to construct his scala naturae. These cases, where the parts or characteristics of animals are labelled phaula (failed), are seldom discussed. 'The failure', as Stravrianeas puts it, 'generalises over the whole population of a natural kind' (p.57). He proceeds to argue that the failure is in comparison to a wider grouping to which the animal belongs -- such as four footed. For example, the seal belongs to the four-footed kind but its hind legs are under-developed and so it locomotes in a defective, dragging manner (p.61). The way in which natural essences fall off from perfection is built into the natural world, which explains how defects are in a way contrary and in a way in accordance with nature (Generation of Animals IV.4, 770b12-15). Stravrianeas locates the causes of regular 'deformities' within the generative process, where male and female influences battle it out for dominance (Generation of Animals IV.3-4).

Stravrianeas's is an extremely rich and rewarding chapter. It is only to be lamented that there was no scope for expanding this discussion to other types of regular bad results in nature, for example animals that are prone to produce deformed young (Generation of Animals IV ref), hybrids (Generation of Animals II.4, 8) and animals with behavioural difficulties (Historia Animalium VIII-IX). The chapter also invites reflection on the causes of human vice and evil. After all, there must be a natural basis for human behaviours and tendencies, variations in humans (women, slave, barbarian) and their defects and diseases. The degeneration and diseases that are in some sense natural to humans are touched on but not further discussed in the other chapters in the volume. These discussions might have profited from employing Stavrianeas' framework for natural defects in Aristotle's world.

The volume's broad scope allows Daniel C. Russell ('Practical Unintelligence and the Vices') to explore the under-theorised vices which involve 'practical unintelligence'. More specifically, he focuses on cases where, although the agent is not responsible for her ignorance (which makes practical wisdom impossible) another aspect of phronesis requires compensating or 'correcting for' ignorance. This enriches and expands our understanding of the role of phronesis in decision making, but it may be quite a stretch to think of this as a discussion of 'evil' in Aristotle.

Meanwhile, Jonathan Beere's 'Badness as Posteriority to Capacity in Metaphysics Theta 9' offers a novel and promising explanation of the bad being 'posterior to capacity' (1051a17-19). This thought creates a puzzle: The energeia (activity or actuality, but never translated in the essay) of a capacity seems always to be better than the capacity. But Aristotle also claims that the capacity is worse in the case of a bad energeia (pp.34-5). On top of this, a bad energeia would look to be prior rather than posterior to a capacity. The solution is to realise that vice is the corruption of the capacity to develop virtue in the individual. This, then, is 'how the badness in question is posterior in being to the capacity' -- the capacity is supposed to develop toward virtues and is thwarted toward vice. Thus, vice is not the development of this capacity but the destruction of it. This requires seeing the capacity for virtue as two-tiered -- beginning with a capacity at birth that requires correct education and socialisation before it becomes a further capacity for virtue (p.45). The solution is ingenious but quite speculative, given the lack of detail in the Metaphysics and the absence in that text of any explicit connections to moral psychology or the social development of behavioural capacities.

Although this reader remains unconvinced that Aristotle had a concept or theory of 'evil', the focus of this volume highlights the relative neglect of his various views on the less than good. Many of these essays are essential reading for anyone interested in vice, tyrants, and political and mental disorders in Aristotle's thought.