Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy

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Neiman, Susan, Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2002, 370pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691096082.

Reviewed by Fred Rush , University of Notre Dame


‘The Knight and his squire ride across a heath which stretches towards the horizon. Beyond it lies the sea, calm and shimmering in the morning sun. Close by, a scrawny dog is whining, crawling towards its master, who is sitting asleep in the hot sun. A black cloud of flies clusters about his head and shoulders. The squire, Jöns, dismounts and approaches the sleeping man. He addresses him politely. When he does not receive an answer, he walks up to the man in order to shake him awake. He bends over the man’s shoulder, but quickly pulls back his hand. The man falls backward on the heath, his face turned towards the squire. It is a corpse, staring at the squire with empty eye sockets and blanched teeth. Jöns remounts and overtakes his master.

Knight: Well, did he show you the way?
Jöns: Not exactly.
Knight: What did he say?
Jöns: Nothing.
Knight: Was he mute?
Jöns: No, sir. I wouldn’t say that. As a matter of fact, he was quite eloquent.
Knight: Oh?
Jöns: Yes, eloquent enough. The trouble is that what he had to say was most depressing’.

The Seventh Seal is set during the Black Death. The Knight and squire are traveling back to the Knight’s hold after a decade fighting in the Crusades. The Knight has also encountered Death, is probing his purposes in a game of chess, and has likewise found him eloquent, if a bit more loquacious. The Knight and Jöns have vastly different views on death and suffering. For the Knight they are objects to question for which one seeks reasons; Death is, in personified form, a conversant. For the squire suffering and death are brute and factual, precisely not mysteries to probe and not matters to justify. As it will turn out, it is the naturalistic Jöns, and not the metaphysical Knight, who is capable of true compassion for those who suffer. When the travelers encounter a town girl about to be burned for witchcraft, it is the squire that offers her water and comfort. The Knight is bent solely on discovering whether her visions of the devil, of evil, are true. She is, for him, an ecstatic proxy.

Susan Neiman’s Evil in Modern Thought is a sustained meditation on the importance of death and suffering as themes for the development of modern philosophy. Neiman’s leading thought is that the history of Western philosophy from, roughly, the sixteenth century to the present should be reoriented in terms of the various reactions to the question of theodicy. A theodicy is a demonstration that the world is good for humanity in spite of what seems to be widespread suffering. In the modern era there are two main strands of theodicy. The first attempts to argue that what finite creatures within the world view as evil is really only evil when viewed ‘locally’. Evils are necessitated by the overall requirements of the ‘best possible world’, a product of God’s will to create the most diverse world consistent with the requirements of parsimony. Because such creation is a perfection of God, it is good in itself and anything necessarily flowing from it is good as well. It is argued that finite creatures can be reconciled to the world, and be generally optimistic about it, on this basis. According to theodicies of the first sort, all phenomena of the world are candidates for the ascription of ethical terms, including natural events. Evil is present in the world both in terms of natural disaster and human wrongdoing.

The most prominent historical representative of the first line is, of course, Leibniz—the theodical Knight par excellence. The immensity of the destruction caused by the Lisbon Earthquake of 1755, coupled with the expanding confidence of Newtonian science, made theodical projects like Leibniz’s questionable, to put it mildly. Intellectual reaction to the earthquake undercut the category of natural evil and shifted the focus of theodical justification to squaring the existence of moral evil (i.e. evil caused by human agency) with the idea of providence. This approach spares divine will the reproaches of nature, but it introduces the unsettling idea that nature is indifferent to human purposes. We might master such nature to a degree by understanding it—by developing scientific theories about it which have predictive power, etc.—but nature cannot be demonstrated to be a set of purposes uniquely attuned to our well-being.

Thus, the second branch of modern theodicy, which denies the reality of natural evil and argues that the possibility of moral evil is concomitant to that of free will. Since human freedom is a very important good (in fact, the good) a world that permits its existence, even if partly evil, is good overall. Because evil is limited to events that are in principle within at least some degree of human control, one can be optimistic about at least the potential for moral progress and thus for an overall diminution of evil. One characteristically modern way to carry forth this form of theodicy is to make nature carry the brunt of human happiness and virtue as nature, as one finds in Rousseau’s conception of human history. Moral evil is present according to Rousseau because of humankind’s descent into unnaturalness. Even though history so far is a story of a fall away from the natural because of socialization, Rousseau believes that humankind (and history) can be redeemed within history by an arduous process of re-education. Hegel adopts and expands upon elements of Rousseau’s optimism in his famous offer of a ‘true theodicy’, arguing that suffering is the unavoidable engine of our dialectically progressive self-consciousness. Marx in turn re-naturalizes this line of thought in terms of the development of species-being through economic revolution.

Neiman does a fine job of fleshing out both lines of development and relating them to the contemporaneous, and much more negative, views of Bayle, Voltaire and Hume. The book makes the first of two decisive turns, however, with its discussion of Kant. Kant’s account of both the impetus to construct theodicies and of their permissible philosophical role is of fundamental historical importance. For the most part he is negative and his being so involves the special and restricted role God (or, more precisely, the idea of God) can play in the critical philosophy. Traditional theodicies demand that virtue be ultimately rewarded with happiness, and Kant holds that this is beyond philosophical proof. Moreover, as Neiman rightly emphasizes (pp. 67-70), Kant thinks that such a demonstrable connection between virtue and happiness would undermine morality. Kant recognizes the unity of virtue and happiness as an object of hope and argues that the best we can do is strive to be worthy of happiness. He is realistic enough to see that this hope is very hard to maintain if one restricts the possibility for happiness to life and so he believes that we must posit an afterlife and God in order to carry through the thought of worthiness. But this is just an idea whose truth is beyond proof. Unlike his predecessors in either line of theodicy under consideration, Kant does not credit any version of the ontological argument and this seals the case on any traditional theodicy. However, a de-ontologized version of the argument from design does figure importantly in Kant’s aesthetic theory, and Neiman is right to look there for Kant’s ‘positive’ answer to the question of the prospects for theodicy (pp. 82-83). Her earlier book, The Unity of Reason (Oxford, 1994) is a very subtle treatment of many of the issues having to do with the systematic impact of Kant’s account of reflective judgment. It is a bit disappointing, therefore, that Neiman does not spend much time on the theodical content of Kant’s aesthetics. Kant’s guiding thought—that ‘being at home in’ the world can be, at best, a matter of a feeling that is a product of wanting to see oneself in that light—sets later theodicy firmly on an aesthetic course.

Neiman next explores the nineteenth century fall-out from the Kantian re-orientation in Schopenhauer, Sade, Nietzsche and Freud. Each is resolutely against the idea that moral evil can be justified or finally eliminated, and each denies the existence of God that Kant had already relegated to mere regulative moral importance. Now, one might think that this would mean that these thinkers are untouched by the project of theodicy. If God does not exist, what point is there to a project centered on justifying His will? Although each in his own way rejects theodicy, his positive philosophical views are essentially formed by that rebellion. It is the propensity to engage in the deceptions of theodicy that calls for diagnosis—in its own right and as a precondition to any consideration of whether there might be ‘good’ non-theological ways to express the impulse to theodicy. Schopenhauer is a remorseless enemy of any traditional account of transcendent purpose. Life has no purpose, at least not for us (Schopenhauer does seem to think that life has a blind drive to proliferate and sustain itself, but that it has nothing in particular to do with any one of its finite ‘objectifications’). Suffering is all there is to the life of a finite, reflective being and Schopenhauer resists at all costs the idea that suffering is redeemed, a mainstay of theodicy. Neiman hints that Schopenhauer finally slips back into a theodicy of sorts (an a theodicy?) in holding that suffering has value for what underlies the experience of entities, the undifferentiated stuff that Schopenhauer calls ‘Will’ (pp. 198-99). I take her point to be that, even though we are inconsequential bits of perturbating Will the coming into and going out of being of which Will neither celebrates nor mourns, the general process of Will’s objectification requires some such fodder and being it is to be part of the cosmic balance or ‘justice’ of the world.

It is Nietzsche who marks the second turning point in the history of modern philosophy under the aspect of theodicy—he is the true Jöns of Neiman’s story. Following Schopenhauer Nietzsche argues very strongly against traditional theodicy. And he provides a diagnosis of the false appeal of the project in terms of flight from the truth that evil is not a real category at all, a view that is even more stringent than Kant’s or Schopenhauer’s. His project is to understand that deeply-rooted tendency in light of his ‘affirmative pessimism’ or, alternatively, in light of the need for a ‘rebirth of tragedy’ (an early formulation of the idea). Although Nietzsche has a very dim view of traditional theodicy, he does believe that one can exercise the theodical impulse in a way that is not entirely delusional. Theodicy for Nietzsche, as he says over and over again, is an aesthetic matter. A precise formulation of this thought is quite difficult, but stating its core content is not. Nietzsche thinks that one can ‘justify’ the world to the extent that one can put oneself in its place by enjoying the sheer creation and destruction of images or representations. He identifies the experience of art (of a certain type) as at least one way of entering into this frame of mind. Although Nietzsche comes to reject tragedy as the compass according to which one’s views on life must be set, the idea of aesthetic theodicy never loses importance for him. Neiman only treats the idea superficially, however (p. 225). This means that she misses the main thrust of Nietzsche’s views on theodicy, but this inattention has repercussions beyond the specific treatment of Nietzsche. The idea of an aesthetic theodicy begins with Kant and tracing the descent of that idea from Kant to Nietzsche is a very important way to reconstruct the pertinent history. Neiman’s cursory treatment of Nietzsche’s aesthetic views combines with the scant attention she pays to the third Critique to make the Kant-Nietzsche line of reaction less compelling than it is. This deficit also has substantial effect on the last chapter of the book, where Neiman traces theodical thought and reactions to it into the twentieth century. Two of the thinkers that figure prominently there, Adorno and Arendt, have important ties to programs of aesthetic theodicy. A more substantial discussion of aesthetic theodicy is also important for ‘negative’ reasons. One thinker very drawn to theodicy whom Neiman does not mention at all, Heidegger, is very closely connected to the problem of the ‘aesthetization of politics’ that is often thought to have contributed to the intellectual climate that encouraged the development of Fascism. Given the evil of that, which Neiman discusses at length later in the book, it might have been interesting to bring the theodical impulse into connection with the creation of evil, rather than concentrating solely upon its explanatory potential.

Before she turns to the twentieth century treatments of evil, Neiman discusses the question of what effects the horror of Auschwitz have had on conceptions of evil and the possibilities of moral responses to it. Much contemporary literature on the topic of evil centers upon these issues. Neiman’s primary aim is to show how the four twentieth-century reactions she considers fare against the reconception of the nature of evil that the Holocaust requires. Her main point is a familiar one by now, that the theoretical and moral inscrutability of the human evil of the Holocaust outstrips any pre-Holocaust way to understand it. Traditional theodicy was an attempt to penetrate the rational structure of the world in order to be optimistic about one’s prospects for well-being. Understanding the Holocaust fails because in its wake one can no longer make sense of even human intention—evil threatens to have no structure at all. Neiman also devotes a section of the chapter to weighing this thought in terms of September 11. This material is the least successful in the book, extraordinarily under-developed and opinionated. Its presence takes away from the argumentative force of the book at a crucial point and gives the impression of rushing in to say something, anything, about the events of that day. This reaction is certainly not Neiman’s alone, but it is one that should be resisted.

Neiman’s consideration of specific twentieth-century reactions to twentieth-century evil is uneven. One gets the feeling at this point in the book that she simply has too many balls in the air. The discussion of Camus is the best part of this chapter. It is lively and pushes the material in interesting directions. The treatment of the critical theory of Horkheimer and Adorno is, on the other hand, not much above the run-of-the-mill. Her discussion of Horkheimer and Adorno’s treatment of Kant cum Sade in Dialectic of Enlightenment (pp. 192-93) is not very convincing, nor is her account of Adorno’s statements concerning the evil of Auschwitz especially telling. Her true Hausgötter are Arendt and Rawls. Given the theme of post-Holocaust evil, Arendt is a natural focus. Neiman defends Eichmann in Jerusalem as having serious philosophical potential. The leading idea here is that a good start can be made on reorienting philosophical reflection on evil after Auschwitz by allowing for non-intentional action and evil (pp. 271-77, 301-03). Evil is ‘banal’ in Arendt’s famous formulation, not because it is boring, lackluster, or ordinary. Rather, it is banal because of its lack of the sort of intention or purpose one usually attributes as a cause for action. Perhaps there is some sense in which Eichmann (and others) didn’t ‘mean to’ murder Jews, but I am skeptical. That said, there is no doubt important work to be done in developing models of non-intentional agency (Neiman does not discuss the rich contemporary French sources in this area). But Arendt does not develop anything of the sort, at least not in detail. That is what makes her remark about ‘banality’ so potentially objectionable—there is no real theoretical context for it. Thus the phrase ‘banality of evil’ remains a bon mot, all the less bon because uttered in the realm of the unspeakable. Perhaps a more substantial theoretical context can be assembled by going through Arendt’s work in more depth, e.g. her work on totalitarianism, her book on the third Critique and politics and, especially, The Human Condition. The inclusion of Rawls is forced; the connection with theodicy is simply too attenuated.

Evil in Modern Thought not aimed solely at a professional philosophical audience, and its tone and manner of presentation reflect that fact. I found the less academic style welcome and engaging, others may not. On the negative side, the breadth of intended audience does mean that Neiman sometimes short-changes argument and detailed exposition. Notwithstanding this, the book is full of specific remarks that are very insightful. And the driving historiographic idea of the book—that one basic way of conceiving of the development of modern philosophy is along theodical lines—is very promising. Finally, whether one identifies more with the Knight or Jöns, evil is a standing philosophical problem. It is important to see that problem in the broader philosophical context that Neiman has opened for investigation.