Evolution and Belief: Confessions of a Religious Paleontologist

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Robert J. Asher, Evolution and Belief: Confessions of a Religious Paleontologist, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 300pp., $24.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780521193832.

Reviewed by Derek Turner, Connecticut College


Robert Asher is a paleontologist who specializes in the evolution of mammals. His book tries to do two things at once: It offers an up-to-date picture of the evolution, genetics, and developmental biology of mammals, and it makes a foray into the public discussion of religion and science. The former project is entirely successful, but philosophers will find that this book does little to advance the discussion of evolution and religion.

The best reason to read Evolution and Belief is to learn something about the evolution of mammals. Asher treats us to riveting discussions of the place of living groups, such as monotremes and tarsiers, that seem like intermediate forms; (Chapter 3); punctuated equilibria and species selection (Chapter 4); the evolution of mammalian ear bones from the jaws of our predecessors, the cynodonts, therapsids, and pelycosaurs (Chapter 5); the place of elephants in the mammalian tree of life (Chapter 6); the phylogenetic relationships between toothed and baleen whales (Chapter 7); and the ways in which new molecular evidence has led scientists to rethink earlier phylogenetic reconstructions (Chapter 9). Asher shows how bringing together work in developmental biology and genetics with the study of fossils can yield interesting results. He dumbs nothing down, and his presentation of the science is rich with empirical detail. Who knew, for example, that the developing fetuses of baleen whales have rudimentary teeth? This book will reawaken your inner natural history buff.

Asher has written a fantastic book about mammals that's embedded within a larger discussion of science and religion. That larger discussion is more philosophical, but less exciting.

In the prologue and opening chapter, Asher argues that paleontological science neither supports nor undermines belief in God. He claims that "while science is a-religious, it is not anti-religious" (p. xviii). Science, he argues, is religiously neutral to the extent that it is governed by methodological naturalism, the rule that "one should not use supernatural phenomena to explain causation in the natural world" (p. 15). He stresses that "understanding how evolution works does not address the potential 'who' or 'why' behind it" (p. xxiii). Science should restrict its focus to questions about how things work, or as Asher puts it, to questions about cause. Religion should limit itself to questions about who if anyone is behind those things, and what if anything those things ultimately mean. Religion, as he puts it, should restrict its focus to questions about supernatural agency.

From Asher's accommodationist perspective, creationism and ID theory look like encroachments by religion against territory that properly belongs to science. His label for those who would explain natural events in terms of supernatural agency is "superstitious" (p. 12). Science, he thinks, does conflict with superstitions such as young Earth creationism. On the other hand, those who try to draw anti-religious consequences from science are engaging in the same sort of overreaching, but from the opposite direction. Richard Dawkins, for example, plays into the hands of creationists and ID theorists by making evolution seem more threatening to religion than it really is.

Asher's accommodationist view is a familiar one. Michael Ruse has long argued that one can be an evolutionist and a theist without contradiction.[1] Nor does one need to look very far to find other paleontologists who have defended accommodationism. Asher acknowledges that he basically agrees with Stephen Jay Gould's view that science and religion are "non-overlapping magisteria" (p. 18).[2] Simon Conway Morris, another paleontologist whose work receives brief attention in Chapter 11, has also argued that evolution and theism are compatible.[3] Asher does not introduce any new arguments for accommodationism.

Beginning in Chapter 2, Asher frames his discussion of the evolution of mammals as a response to intelligent design (ID) theory. He undertakes to show that what we've learned about mammals strongly confirms the central claims of evolutionary theory, especially Darwin's claim that living groups, such as whales and hippos, are related by common ancestry. Along the way, he develops some familiar criticisms of ID theory. Perhaps the hope is that those who have doubts about evolution will be more receptive to arguments offered by someone who has confessed to being a theist at the outset. One concern, though, is that those who sympathize with ID theory might resist Asher's version of theism as much as they resist evolution.

Whether historical science is anti-religious depends on what religious beliefs we are talking about. If the view on offer is just that the universe owes its existence to some sort of intelligent supernatural agent, then religion is obviously compatible with the latest historical science. You can always eliminate any conflict with scientific findings by watering down your theistic commitments until they approach something like deism. The version of theism that Asher ends up defending is pretty thin, and he struggles at times (e.g., on p. 228) to differentiate it from deism. In one memorable line, he writes that "the divinity I see in Christian scripture is the author of the Book of Nature, not its critic" (p. 26).

On p. 25, there is a confession that is, perhaps, more surprising than a paleontologist's confession that he believes in God:

Do I believe in miracles? If by "miracle" you mean the spontaneous failure of natural law due to the contrary influence of some supernatural agency, then no. I don't believe that such things happen -- not now, not 2000 years ago. However, this is not at all the same thing as denying the power or existence of divinity, including the Christian sort.

Many Christians, however, think that the whole point of Christianity is that a supernatural God directly intervened in history. It's hard to see how one can be a Christian without believing, for instance, in the resurrection that's celebrated on Easter. As David Hume saw so clearly, some miracles are non-negotiable because of their centrality to religious tradition.

A no-miracles theist like Asher who goes no further than vague affirmations of the existence of some sort of supernatural agent can still affiliate culturally with one or the other religious tradition, in much the same way that one identifies with the local hockey team (that's Asher's own example, from p. xvii). The problem here is that if the only form of religion that turns out to respect the boundary that accommodationists draw between religion and science is thin-theism-plus-cultural-affiliation, the religion we're left with seems diminished. To his great credit, Asher recognizes this problem and faces it with admirable intellectual honesty. He just thinks that thin-theism-plus-cultural-affiliation is enough.

Accommodationists like Asher hold that as long as science and religion remain in their proper spheres, focused only on the questions appropriate to their respective domains, no conflict can arise. Adherence to methodological naturalism guarantees that science will be religiously neutral. However, methodological naturalism is not itself religiously neutral. Alvin Plantinga has expressed puzzlement as to why someone who has a prior commitment to Christian theism should espouse methodological naturalism.[4] Another alternative would be to defend a "theistic science" in which scientists are permitted to entertain supernatural causes for natural events. For someone who, like Asher, is a theist from the outset, the question whether to pursue naturalistic versus theistic science is at some level a theological one. His endorsement of methodological naturalism places him at odds with others who have different theological commitments. Accommodationists such as Asher are fond of saying that methodological naturalism is "a rule of science" (p. 15). How can science be religiously neutral if one of its ground rules is theologically controversial?

A further problem with Asher's accommodationism is just that there really are points of friction between paleontological science and religion. In Chapter 11, Asher offers a lovely exposition of the notion of historical contingency, an idea that Gould popularized in his 1989 book, Wonderful Life. Gould argued that downstream evolutionary outcomes are highly sensitive even to the smallest variations in earlier conditions. If you rewind the tape of evolutionary history all the way to the Cambrian period and play it back again while tweaking earlier conditions ever so slightly, human beings never evolve:

We came this close (put your thumb about a millimeter away from your index finger), thousands and thousands of times, to erasure by the veering of history down another sensible channel. Replay the tape a million times from a Burgess beginning, and I doubt that anything like Homo sapiens would ever evolve again. [5]

Gould was explicitly attacking the view that evolutionary history was, in some sense, leading up to us all along. Asher doesn't mention this aspect of Gould's discussion of contingency.

One thing that Judaism, Christianity, and Islam all agree upon is their anthropocentrism. Human beings are what the cosmic drama is all about. You can try to excise the anthropocentrism, but then you're left with a version of theism so diluted that it bears little resemblance to any living religious tradition. Theists who take the anthropocentrist commitment seriously will feel some pressure to say that all of evolutionary history was, in some sense, leading up to us. Gould's argument about contingency poses a threat to that view.[6] At the very least, there is a superficial tension here between paleontological science and religious tradition. Maybe the tension is merely superficial, but that needs to be shown. Incidentally, Gould himself seems not to have noticed that his defense of evolutionary contingency might not be consistent with his view that science and religion are "non-overlapping magisteria." Asher seems not to have noticed it either.

Asher's own writing about the evolution of whales and elephants is so effective that it could well induce doubts about anthropocentrism. One comes away from his book with the sense that the unlikely twists and turns of their evolutionary stories are every bit as thrilling as ours, and that we have no greater claim to being the protagonists of the cosmic drama.

[1] M. Ruse, Can A Darwinian Be a Christian? Cambridge University Press, 2000.

[2] S.J. Gould, Rocks of Ages: Science and Religion in the Fullness of Life. Ballantine Books, 1999.

[3] S. Conway Morris, Life's Solution: Inevitable Humans in a Lonely Universe. Cambridge University Press, 2003.

[4] A. Plantinga, "Methodological Naturalism?" in J. Van der Meer, ed., Facets of Faith and Science, vol. 1. University Press of America, 1996, pp. 177-221.

[5] S.J. Gould, Wonderful Life: The Burgess Shale and the Nature of History. W.W. Norton, 1989, p. 289, emphasis in the original.

[6] Compare M. Ruse, "A Darwinian Can Be a Christian, Too," The Huffington Post (24 June 2010).  Last accessed on 23 July, 2012.