Evolution and the Levels of Selection

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Samir Okasha, Evolution and the Levels of Selection, Oxford University Press, 2006, 300pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199267979.

Reviewed by Jonathan Michael Kaplan, Oregon State University


In Evolution and the Levels of Selection Samir Okasha presents a careful and thorough analysis of the current state of play of attempts to formally analyze questions surrounding the level(s) at which natural selection can and does operate.  As Okasha notes in his introduction, relatively few philosophers of biology make use of either the formal mathematical techniques or the key concepts employed by those mathematically-oriented biologists who have addressed these issues, and part of Okasha's stated goal is to bridge that gap (p 1).  Here he surely succeeds -- every philosopher of biology interested in aspects of the levels of selection debates ought to confront this material, and should think seriously about how the positions he or she has staked out fits into the frameworks Okasha outlines.  The book's major weakness likewise emerges from the focus on the formal techniques that have been under-analyzed in philosophical circles; it is not always clear -- either in Okasha's book or in the work of theoretical population genetics more generally -- how the (often messy) biological facts interact with the mathematical formalisms, or how useful the formalisms are for understanding the behavior of real biological systems.

The first half of Okasha's book is focused on formal treatments of the level of selection question.  This includes exploring the relationship between the statistical analyses and various informal criteria for 'group selection' that have appeared in the literature, as well as attempting to explicate the implications that different possible causal structures might have for evolutionary change.  The second half deals with a number of specific cases and questions, including the possibility of species-level selection, and how we ought to conceptualize the formation of the kinds of collectives upon which selection can operate.

Early in the book, Okasha distinguishes between two fundamentally different senses in which there can be selection in biological systems in which there exist identifiable part-whole relationships ("particles" and "collectives"), that is, for there to be multi-level selection.  In the first sense, MLS1, the focus is on the individual parts, not the wholes they make up.  Collective fitness is just the average fitness of the particles in that collective (collective fitness type 1, or fitness1), and the question about the level at which selection is taking place, intuitively, is about whether properties of the collective are important to particle fitness, and if so, whether or not those properties are simply the result of selection at the individual level.  In the second interpretation of multi-level selection, MLS2, the fitness of collectives and particles are computed and tracked independently; the fitness of a collective is defined as the (expected average) number of offspring collectives it leaves (collective fitness type 2, or fitness2), not as the average fitness of the particles it is made up out of.  The fitness of the individual particles is tracked separately, as are the 'life-cycles' of particles and the collectives.

The immediate tasks of, roughly, the first half of the book are a) to consider under what conditions multi-level selection should be thought of as taking place, and b) to compare statistical decompositions of selection with respect to their success at tracking our intuitions regarding (a).  Okasha's short answer is that "there cannot be a fully general solution to the problem of causally decomposing the total evolutionary change in an MLS1 scenario" and that since it turns out that "the biological interpretations of the fitness structures is … crucial" to determining the correct causal decomposition, there is "a limit to the extent to which the levels-of-selection can be addressed in purely abstract terms" (p 157).  Okasha arrives at this conclusion after comparing a number of formal statistical approaches to attempting to determine the correct casual structure of selection in multi-level scenarios.  Interestingly, while Okasha makes use of 'causal graphs' to explain key concepts, he does not for example explore the use of directed path analysis or structural equation modeling as a general statistical approach (though aspects of these general methods are of course used in the specific approaches he details); the book would, I think, have benefited from considering e.g. Shipley's 2000 book on statistical analysis and causation in biology.  But in any event, below, I very briefly sketch the main approaches that Okasha analyzes.

The first statistical approach Okasha considers is that given by the Price Equation.  The Price equation treats the average change in a particular character trait from one generation to the next as the sum of: 1) the covariance of that character trait in individual entities and fitness, and 2) the average parent-offspring character deviations (the transmission fidelity, roughly equivalent to a measure of heritability).  For cases in which the entities in question form hierarchical collectives, the global covariance between character trait and fitness can be further analyzed in order to take account of population structure.  In the MLS1 interpretation, the global covariance between character trait and fitness is the sum of: 1) the covariance between the average character value of the collectives and the fitness of those collectives (in the fitness1 sense above) and 2) the average covariance of particle character and particle fitness within collectives.  On one natural-seeming interpretation, the first of these terms measures the collective-level selection (selection due to population structure) and the second measures individual level selection (selection independent of population structure).

However, this interpretation of the Price equation implies that there is collective-level selection whenever the average character value of a collective and the average fitness of particles within that collective co-vary; Okasha notes that this conclusion should be resisted (p 86).  Citing an example of Sober's in which the average character value within a collective and collective fitness covary, but where it seems intuitively obvious that all the selection is at the particle level[1], Okasha notes that "cross-level by-products" complicate treating the approach to multi-level selection given by Price's equations as non-problematic.  This leads to another approach at analyzing the causal structure of levels of selection, one that attempts to explicitly deal with the problem of cross-level by-products.  Contextual analysis addresses this issue by using multiple-regression to analyze the fitness of each particle into the sum of the character value of that particle, controlling for the character value of the collective, and the character value of the collective, controlling for the character value of the individual particle (one could easily add terms for non-linear interactions to this, as well) (p 87). 

The contextual analysis approach fails by detecting selection at the level of the collective where intuitively there is none; specifically, in the case of segregation distortion in diploid organisms where the fitness of the organisms is assumed to be equal, Okasha shows that contextual analysis attributes selection to the character value of the collective when individual particle fitness is controlled (p 154-155).  However, since we have assumed that the fitness of the organisms is equal, this conclusion is unwarranted.  In another version using multiple-regression, the "neighbour approach," the key term is not the effect of the collective character on the fitness of the individual (controlling for the effect of the individual's character on its fitness) but rather the effect of the individual's neighbors on its fitness (controlling for the effect of the individual's character on its fitness), that is, on the average character value of the other members of the collective but not of the individual particle itself (p 198-199).  The problem with this approach is that it is unable to properly deal with some characters of well-formed collectives (p 201-202).

The pay-off for working through all these techniques is two-fold.  First, readers are introduced to some of the various ways in which selection can be partitioned.  While these methods have been discussed elsewhere, they have not been compared to each other in the ways that Okasha does, and his analyses bring out the strengths and weaknesses of the various approaches.  The second lesson is more subtle; it becomes increasingly clear that properly understanding the way that selection works in different biological cases demands that we attend to the biological details of those cases, and not just to the formal structure given by changes in trait frequencies over time.  This observation applies not just to the level of selection debate (Okasha's focus) but, as I have argued elsewhere, to e.g. the use of multiple regression analysis in understanding the operation of selection on linked traits (Lande-Arnold approaches; see Pigliucci and Kaplan 2006).  Moving from the statistical patterns to causal claims generally requires not better formalisms, but rather detailed knowledge of the biological cases.

However, it is not always clear that Okasha really appreciates the importance of this observation.  The book shares with much of the literature on levels of selection a certain 'dryness' -- there are relatively few biological examples in the text, and those biological examples given tend to be short on details.  Even in the examples given, a reader interested in how, for example, the key parameters could be estimated in wild populations, or the key variables controlled for in practice, is basically out of luck.  There is of course some value in exploring the limits of formal methods under the assumption that all the key parameters are knowable and known.  For example, Okasha demonstrates how one can use the formal analyses to show that particular kinds of evolutionary scenarios are only possible if particular parameters fall within certain ranges; strong altruism, defined as actions that reduce the donor's absolute fitness, can only evolve if the groups are formed assortatively (p. 193-195).  But one might argue that without the biological details, it is unclear if the parameters modeled even make sense.

Early in the book, Okasha claims that "Price's equation … provides a formal vindication of the 'force' metaphor that Matthen and Ariew oppose" because one can (at least in principle) use the Price equation to show that the total change in the value of a character trait within a population can be partitioned into a component that represents the change caused by selection and a component that represents the change caused by random drift (p 33).  But this treats Matthen and Ariew's objection as an objection to the in-principle possible partitioning of the changes in the population mean by some technique or other; such an objection would of course be absurd, as there is always some way of partitioning changes.  The problem is not that it is impossible to assign a value to the difference between the expected change in a population and the actual change, and call that "drift."  The problem is that there is nothing happening (no causal process occurring) in a population in which the character trait of interest changes in a way different from the average (or expected) change that is not occurring in a population in which the change in character trait does not differ from the average/expected change (see Matthen and Ariew 2002, Pigliucci and Kaplan 2006).  The ability to "decompose" the total change into components does not, as far as I can see, reveal anything about the casual processes that are in fact occurring.

The question of what, if anything, constitutes a selective force matters, because for example Okasha uses the notion of experiencing "a common selective force" as part of the demarcation criteria for a population undergoing selection (p 217).  But just what is a "common selective force" and how do we, in practice, identify such things?  Not, it seems clear, through statistical analyses alone, no matter how sophisticated.  While the answer must lie in the details of the biological cases being considered, the reader, again, is given little hint about how this process should go, or how it is related to the statistical analyses in question.

Okasha points out that the existence of hierarchical organization is often assumed in level of selection debates, and the last chapter of the book is devoted to arguing that understanding the evolution of hierarchical organization is important and under-appreciated.  The difference is between treating levels of selection questions synchronically -- given a particular biological hierarchy, how is selection acting -- and treating levels of selection questions diachronically -- asking how selection could have shaped the evolution of particular biological hierarchies, how, in other words, the hierarchies themselves could have evolved.  Okasha argues that an MLS1 conception of multi-level selection is appropriate early in the evolution of collectives -- in these cases, group structure may be important, but the groups lack the cohesion necessary to interact with the world as individuals in their own right whose fitness matters independently of the fitness of the particles that make them up.  At some point, however, the collectives may evolve sufficient cohesion that treating them as individuals and tracking the fitness of the collectives independently of the fitness of the particles that make them up begins to make sense; here, the MLS2 conception of multi-level selection becomes most appropriate.  As Okasha rightly points out, because collectives evolved, there will of course be borderline cases (see e.g. p 237).  But the point is that multi-level selection of both the MLS1 and MLS2 forms will be important for understanding major evolutionary transitions, such as the formation of multi-cellularity, and indeed the formation of cohesive RNA communities, and hence that "group selection" (or at least its effects), far from being "a theoretical curiosity," is ubiquitous (p 222).  Here, again, a few more detailed biological examples would have been helpful.  While Okasha notes that too much philosophy of biology is focused on multicellular life and treats it as basic (p 221-222), the focus of this chapter is itself primarily the evolution of multicellular life, and, of course, there aren't yet many details available regarding how, precisely, that transition took place.  But considering the possible roles of multi-level selection in cooperative behavior in bacterial colonies, for example, might have provided a broader perspective on these issues, and one in which particular kinds of experiments designed to control for variables would in fact be possible  (see Parsek and Greenberg 2005 for an introduction to social behavior in bacteria).

But these quibbles notwithstanding, Okasha has written an extremely important book.  While I wished for more biological details and examples, there is more than sufficient value in exploring the formalisms and important distinctions that emerge from them to make the book required reading for anyone working on the levels of selection question. 


Hilborn, R. and M. Mangel 1997.  The Ecological Detective: Confronting Models with Data. Princeton University Press.  NJ.

Parsek, M.R. and E.P. Greenberg.  2005.  "Sociomicrobiology: the connections between quorum sensing and biofilms." TRENDS in Microbiology 13(1): 27-33.

Matthen, M. and A. Ariew. 2002. "Two Ways of Thinking About Fitness and Natural Selection" The Journal of Philosophy 992.: 55-83.

Pigliucci, M. and J. Kaplan. 2006. Making Sense of Evolution: Conceptual Foundations of Evolutionary Biology. Chicago University Press. Chicago, IL.

Shipley, B. 2000. Cause and Correlation in Biology: a User's Guide to Path Analysis, Structural Equations and Causal Inference. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, England.


[1] Imagine a population in which fitness is causally associated with height (and nothing else).  If this population forms groups, then average group height and average group fitness will co-vary.  But belonging to a tall group provides no fitness advantage -- all the work is done by the height of the individual organisms.  Statistically, of course, Price's equation is "correct" but it is causally misleading.