Evolutionary Ethics and Contemporary Biology

Placeholder book cover

Giovanni Boniolo and Gabriele De Anna (eds.), Evolutionary Ethics and Contemporary Biology, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 220pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521856299.

Reviewed by William J. FitzPatrick, Virginia Tech


This collection of ten essays (several co-authored) by an international group of philosophers and biologists aims to explore the implications of neo-Darwinian evolutionary theory for our understanding of ethics. In keeping with the interdisciplinary spirit of the volume, 'ethics' is here understood very broadly, such that the study of ethics includes everything from philosophical inquiry into the existence and nature of ethical truth and justification to scientific inquiry into the causal origins of human capacities, emotions, and behaviors commonly categorized as 'ethical'. This, combined with the inclusion of treatments of methodological issues in evolutionary biology and surveys of biological work, makes for a wide range of topics and approaches with rather less unity than the label "evolutionary ethics" might suggest. The result is a set of discussions that vary significantly in their philosophical depth and sophistication.

Most of the essays are concerned in one way or another with how far evolutionary theory can go toward 'explaining ethics' in the sense of accounting for the origins of certain human traits: our general capacity for normative guidance, our disposition to engage in evaluative judgment and to feel it to have objective authority over us, our disposition to feel emotions such as guilt or shame, or to adopt familiar social norms or codes involving cooperation, altruism, marriage practices, and so on. From the perspective of moral philosophy, the most interesting question is what implications, if any, our answer to this explanatory question has for normative ethics and metaethics -- and, equally importantly (though typically overlooked), vice versa. From a scientific perspective, the explanatory question itself is the focus, the issues being how far evolutionary considerations can go in explaining 'ethical phenomena', what the correct explanations are, and what methodologies to employ in finding this out.

The moral philosopher's concerns make cameo appearances in various places, but are dealt with directly only in three essays, with disappointing results. In a chapter entitled "Is Darwinian Metaethics Possible (And If It Is, Is It Well Taken)?", Michael Ruse argues that Darwinism supports "ethical skepticism" -- something like Mackie's error theory -- while also explaining why the illusion of ethical truth and objectivity persists. The discussion covers no new philosophical ground, however, and the argument is insufficiently developed to pose a serious challenge to opponents.

Ruse begins with the observation that "morality is an adaptation like hands and teeth and penises and vaginas" (16), where 'morality' here refers just to certain empirical phenomena associated with human social life, such as a capacity and tendency for cooperation. From this he concludes that there are no moral truths: "substantive morality is a kind of illusion" (21). This conclusion does not, of course, follow from the mere premise that some basic capacities and dispositions associated with cooperation are products of evolution, and Ruse recognizes that further argument is needed. Moral realists can grant that the intelligence implicated in moral judgment is a product of evolution (either as an adaptation itself or as a spin-off of mental adaptations, along for the ride), and even that some particular psychological and behavioral tendencies reflect specific shaping by our natural selection history (such as a disposition to philander). They will maintain, however, that just as we can put our intelligence to use in autonomous disciplines such as mathematical logic or high energy particle physics, we can likewise put it to reflective use in discovering truths about how it is good and right to live -- truths that may partly line up with the dispositions that make up our evolutionary heritage, but may also partly fly in the face of them.

There may, of course, be no such truths to apprehend, as the irrealist claims, but this is not supported merely by pointing to evolutionary influences on some of our basic capacities and dispositions. And it would just beg the question against the realist -- though this is standard practice in discussions of evolutionary psychology -- to assume that all of our moral dispositions must be attributable to evolutionary shaping mediated merely by similarly shaped 'culture,' as opposed to being partly spin-off effects of our autonomous employment of our rational faculties.

Ruse offers little to cast serious doubt on the realist alternative. He likens ethics to spiritualistic superstition (the belief that people are communicating with the dead), and suggests that just as the true causal explanation of what is really going on in the latter case undermines warrant for belief in chatting spirits, so too evolutionary explanations undermine warrant for belief in moral truths. But this is again just question-begging. We have good reason to believe the undermining causal explanation in the case of spiritualism; as Ruse notes, in some cases otherwise indistinguishable from others, the allegedly communicating departed during the First World War turned out to have been alive in a field hospital the whole time, making it clear that the whole phenomenon is best explained as a trick of wishful thinking and imagination. In the case of morality, however, we have no good reason to suppose that our 'moral dispositions and behavior' are exhaustively accounted for by evolutionary causal explanations (even as mediated by cultural conditioning); and to the extent that they are not, because they are based on evaluative judgments arrived at through autonomous reflection -- e.g., in the case of privately helping distant strangers out of respect for their intrinsic value -- the warrant for belief in moral truths is untouched by evolutionary considerations.

Before leaving Ruse it is worth noting a similar begging of questions in his argument that belief in moral truth is undermined by the fact that evolution could have supplied us with different dispositions, less geared toward sympathy and cooperation. He thinks this contingency is problematic because it shows that had the evolutionary pressures been different we would now have very different moral beliefs; and recognizing this contingency ought to undermine any confidence that our actual moral beliefs are on the right track. But again, it would do so only if our moral beliefs were generally and exhaustively explained by (culturally mediated) contingent evolutionary influences. If instead many of our reflective moral beliefs are explained by our grasping of moral truths through sound moral reasoning, then it should not bother us that we might have had some different particular dispositions as part of our evolutionary heritage. Insofar as we would still have been moral agents at all, we could still have used our generic intelligence to reason our way to the same basic moral truths, and would simply have had different challenges to overcome where our natural dispositions diverged from them (just as we must, as things are, overcome dispositions toward philandering or xenophobia).

In "The Descent of Instinct and the Ascent of Ethics," Giovanni Boniolo argues plausibly that while Darwin had a theory of the genesis both of the capacity to make and apply moral judgments and of the moral judgments that we make, we are free to accept the former -- as indeed we should -- while rejecting the latter. This is followed, however, by unfortunate metaethical non-sequiturs, such as the claim that there are therefore "no intrinsically moral behaviors but only moral judgments on behaviors," and "morality and immorality are judgment-dependent properties" (37). It is hard to find an argument for such conclusions in the text, though there is passing mention of Montaigne and Nietzsche. Boniolo seems to take these metaethical conclusions to follow from the above Darwinian claim together with the obvious distinction between judgments about behavior and behavior itself. But the inference seems just to result from conflating issues. He notes, for example, that moral judgments may vary across cultures and communities even where certain instinctual or non-instinctual behaviors do not. But nothing follows from this except that the behaviors are not automatically and universally judged moral or immoral; they may still, of course, be intrinsically moral or immoral, as moral realists will claim.

The third chapter in which issues in ethical theory are briefly taken up is "Evolutionary Psychopharmacology, Mental Disorders, and Ethical Behavior," by Stefano Canali, Gabriele De Anna, and Luca Pani. This is really an essay on psychopharmacological methodology, arguing that "drug therapy should take into account the adaptive significance of certain psychiatric symptoms" (111) -- since failure to do so can result in misguided treatments with harmful side-effects -- and that evolutionary considerations also tell against the assumption that "each mental disorder must have one perfectly appropriate cure" to be applied uniformly to all patients. The main discussion is useful and important for the practice of psychiatry, though it has nothing to do with "evolutionary ethics." Unfortunately, the authors try to forge that connection by suggesting that psychiatric norms of mental functioning can be used partly to determine ethical norms, where the psychiatric norms are derived from species-typical natural functional norms, which in turn are supposed to be determined by trying "to figure out what mental properties and capacities an individual must have in order to fall under the concept 'human'" (104).

Here there is appeal in passing to Foot's teleological naturalism, for example, but the philosophical problems with this sort of suggestion are so notorious and deep that nothing helpful can come of a brief discussion at this level.[1] There is a vast philosophical literature on natural function, for example, most of which makes it clear that any notion of natural function rich enough to support the function/accident distinction, and thus to ground non-arbitrary natural norms of proper functioning, will be geared not toward 'flourishing' as such but toward maximizing one's genetic contribution to the next generation; and this makes it irrelevant to ethical normativity. Psychiatrists do, of course, need a conception of normal mental functioning in order to decide what calls for treatment and what counts as success. But these questions will ultimately have to be answered in part through irreducibly ethical reflection on the human good, rather than through any prior naturalistic (or "purely empirical") account of normal human functioning or consideration of the sortal concept 'human' -- a point the authors seem to recognize in places (106), though it is muddied by the problematic appeal to natural function.

The treatment in this volume of issues in ethical theory is thus unsatisfying. By contrast, there is some interesting and helpful discussion of methodological issues in evolutionary explanation, though it is only indirectly related to evolutionary ethics. In "Are Human Beings Part of the Rest of Nature?", Christopher Lang, Elliott Sober and Karen Strier offer a lucid and rigorous examination of problems associated with evolutionary explanations of human traits -- specifically with determining when explanations of human traits are unified with explanations of homologues or analogues in other species, and when they are not (i.e., because different causes have figured into the maintenance or selection of the traits, respectively). They emphasize the need for the right kinds of variation within data sets to make for testable causal hypotheses and to avoid a proliferation of 'just so' stories, and this carries lessons for arguments from intra-species and inter-species comparisons. It also raises problems for generating testable causal hypotheses involving traits unique to human beings.

This has implications for evolutionary psychology, which often proposes evolutionary explanations for distinctively human features while taking them to be species-typical universals. To avoid untestable 'just so' stories it would seem to be necessary either to find sufficient human variation after all or to relate the human traits in relevant ways to more basic traits in other species (52-53). And some of the problems discussed earlier come up again here: it cannot just be assumed, for example, that a bit of altruism performed by a human being self-consciously applying Kantian or Christian principles can be relevantly related to 'altruistic' behavior found in non-human animals.

While some of the other chapters are heavy on survey material (and biological jargon) and somewhat light on argumentative development, there are three very strong chapters -- clear, rigorous and philosophically well-developed -- in the final section, by Francisco Ayala, Philip Kitcher and Alex Rosenberg. In "Biology to Ethics: An Evolutionist's View of Human Nature," Ayala offers a clear-headed and refreshingly contrarian perspective on the origins of our disposition to engage in value judgments and norm-governed behavior. On his view, "we make moral judgments as a consequence of our eminent intellectual abilities," rather than as a "sociocultural correlate of behaviors fostered by biological evolution" (156-57). The discussion provides a carefully developed version of Boniolo's main thesis and a nice illustration of a "disunified" account of the explanation of altruistic behaviors in reflective human beings and that of 'altruistic' behaviors in non-human animals (to borrow the categorization from Lang, Sober and Strier). Such a view construes ethics -- along with literature, art, science and religion -- as an "expression of the high intellectual abilities present in modern humans," where these abilities were favored by natural selection but the particular expressions needn't have been, and needn't be explained even in part by appeal to the causal factors that have generated superficially similar behaviors in other animals (147, 152). While this may go too far in the opposite direction from current trends in evolutionary psychology, it articulates an important possibility for at least some aspects of these expressions of human intelligence, with significant implications for ethical theory, as noted earlier.

Kitcher's and Rosenberg's chapters are perhaps the richest in the collection, and will repay careful study. In "Between Fragile Altruism and Morality: Evolution and the Emergence of Normative Guidance," Kitcher provides a sophisticated and original account of how the human capacity for normative guidance may have arisen in hominid evolution. Roughly, the idea is that a genuine but fragile psychological altruism (involving "a blind tendency to respond to the preferences of another animal with whom you might engage in cooperative activity") evolved as an adaptive strategy in the context of "coalition games," where calculation is infeasible; yet because these altruistic dispositions were fragile and partial, there was always a threat of social rupture and consequent loss of cooperative advantage, requiring costly investments of time and energy in peacemaking, which in turn kept the bands fairly small and limited their range of cooperative ventures. Kitcher's hypothesis is that a capacity for emotionally laden normative guidance then evolved because it offered, through the social development of rules of group loyalty, a solution to the problem of social fragility and resource-wasting peacemaking, reinforcing altruistic tendencies and allowing for larger and more broadly cooperative groups. The discussion, while speculative, is nuanced (with helpful distinctions between various types and dimensions of altruism, for example) and lends support, among other things, to Gibbard's account of normative governance in developing his expressivist metaethics (though the two can of course be separated).[2]

Finally, in "Will Genomics Do More For Metaphysics Than Locke?", Rosenberg takes up the problem of proliferating 'just so' stories mentioned earlier, and argues that comparative genomics offers the best hope for truly testable hypotheses about the evolution of human traits such as cooperation. He begins with an illuminating and accessible discussion of how comparative gene sequencing can turn otherwise speculative questions about recent human prehistory into testable hypotheses -- e.g., about the existence of an 'African Eve' 144,000 years ago, patterns of human migration, and the origins of agriculture in Europe 10,000 years ago (due, according to the genomic evidence, not to cultural evolution but to the displacement of the indigenous population by farmers from the Near East). In the search for data about the origins of human cooperation, the proposal is that "positional gene cloning" in connection with hereditary and genetic defects (such as autism) might be used to identify gene sequences for relatively simple phenotypic components subserving complex cooperative behaviors; this would then allow for comparative computational genomic studies (e.g., with chimps, or with preserved DNA from hominids) to shed light on when and how cooperation evolved, in ways Rosenberg again illustrates very nicely.

In summary, though the quality of the volume as a whole is mixed, and it will likely prove disappointing to those interested in evolutionary ethics from the philosophical perspective of ethical theory, it contains some very fine essays that will be of use to those interested primarily in the scientific explanation of phenomena associated with human social life.


[1] See, for example, John McDowell, "Two Sorts of Naturalism," in R. Hursthouse, G. Lawrence, and W. Quinn (eds.), Virtues and Reasons (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995), 149-180; and William J. FitzPatrick, Teleology and the Norms of Nature (New York: Garland, 2000).

[2] See Allan Gibbard, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1990).