Evolutionary Psychology as Maladapted Psychology

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Robert C. Richardson, Evolutionary Psychology as Maladapted Psychology, MIT Press, 2007, 213pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262182607.

Reviewed by Kelby Mason, Rutgers University


Here's an old joke: why are guinea pigs called guinea pigs? Because they're neither from Guinea nor are they pigs. (I said it was old; I didn't say it was funny.) In recent years a range of philosophers have been making a similar charge against evolutionary psychology, that it's neither evolutionary nor psychology -- or, at least, that it isn't good evolutionary or psychological science. David Buller has most forcefully argued that evolutionary psychology is no good as psychology, and now Robert Richardson has provided the corresponding argument against its evolutionary bona fides (Buller 2005).

Richardson's main contention is that once we hold evolutionary psychology to the same evidential standards applied elsewhere in evolutionary theory, we should reject its "pretensions" as "unconstrained speculation" (p38). On Richardson's account, doing evolutionary science is hard -- really hard -- and evolutionary psychology has simply failed to provide the kind of evidence that is required.

The book starts out with a brief historical discussion, turning quickly from Darwin to the dispute between Thomas Huxley and Herbert Spencer over evolutionary ethics. The point of this is to cast Richardson in the light of Huxley and the evolutionary psychologists in the light of Spencer. Given Spencer's rather dismal reputation since the end of the nineteenth century, the comparison is not meant to flatter the evolutionary psychologists. But Richardson has more in mind than scoring rhetorical points. What he really wants to remind the reader is that you can argue about the specifics of evolutionary theory without disputing the basic fact that humans evolved. Huxley and Spencer debated the one but agreed on the other; similarly, Richardson critiques the claims of evolutionary psychology without for a moment doubting that human minds are the product of evolution by natural selection. Friends of "intelligent design" or Jerry Fodor's recent quixotic assault on Darwinism will find no ally here (Fodor 2008).

Richardson makes another, more curious move towards the start of the book, by drawing on Philip Kitcher's 1985 broadside against sociobiology, Vaulting Ambition (Kitcher 1985). Sociobiology was the controversial precursor to evolutionary psychology, and Kitcher was writing at the height of its controversy. One of the arguments that Kitcher made in that book was, essentially, that we should be especially careful in assessing hypotheses which might have serious real-world implications. If an astronomer gets it wrong, the worst that could happen is a few dodgy papers, or maybe a bad tenure decision. By contrast, if a student of human behaviour gets it wrong, and we develop a wrong-headed social policy as a consequence, the results could be disastrous. Since sociobiology has just such potential consequences, Kitcher argued, we should demand from it an especially high standard of evidence.

Richardson spends some time spelling out Kitcher's argument, and one would think that it has an obvious parallel for the case of evolutionary psychology. If, as Richardson says, "for theories that matter more, we should expect better evidence", then surely we should hold evolutionary psychology to a high standard of evidence (p34). For various evolutionary psychologists purport to tell us about the evolutionary significance of rape, or sex differences in parental investment, or outgroup exclusion, or … in other words, about a lot of stuff that matters a lot. If we're going to use these data to make important choices, whether as individuals or a society, we want to make sure they really are data.

So the stage is set early in the book for a Kitcherian attack on evolutionary psychology as epistemically irresponsible. What's curious about Richardson's sympathetic treatment of Kitcher is that it plays, near enough, no role whatsoever in the discussion that follows. Richardson doesn't, as we might expect, demand an especially high standard of evidence from evolutionary psychology. On the contrary, he is at pains to insist that the standards he is applying are no stricter than those found elsewhere in evolutionary biology.

What Richardson is basically saying at the start of the book is this: on the one hand, we should (due to Kitcherian reasons) demand a higher standard of evidence from evolutionary psychology than from many other scientific research programs. But let's ignore this and just consider the sorts of standards applied elsewhere in evolutionary biology. Even these weaker standards are still too strong for evolutionary psychology; as a piece of evolutionary biology, evolutionary psychology is a failure. The rest of the book is just an elaboration of this argument, illustrated with copious examples.

There are three types of evolutionary evidence that Richardson considers, each of them with its own chapter. First, Richardson discusses what is often called "reverse engineering", which is inferring the selection pressures that shaped a trait by arguing backwards from the observed function of the trait. In one of the examples provided, we consider the marine water strider Halobates. From its water-resistant coating, and the match between its feet and surface tension, we infer that these traits were selected (or "designed" as one says) for walking on water.

It's not immediately obvious what Richardson thinks the real problem is for reverse engineering in evolutionary psychology. But he cites the usual suspects, Gould and Lewontin, and his basic criticism seems to be the same as theirs: reverse engineering in evolutionary psychology is just idle theorizing, just-so storytelling (Gould and Lewontin 1979). What is lacking in the human case is the sort of independent evidence about selection pressures, ancestrally available variation, ancestral population parameters, etc. that could ground these idle fancies.

The second type of evolutionary evidence concerns the "dynamics of adaptation" (it’s not clear to me how that differs from the first type of evidence). Richardson approvingly cites Robert Brandon's list of five conditions for explanations of adaptation based on natural selection: selection, ecological factors, heritability, population structure, and trait polarity (whether a trait is ancestral or derived within a taxonomic group) (Brandon 1990). According to Brandon, the ideal explanation of any particular adaptation would have information about all five of these things, although any actual explanation is likely to fall short. Richardson argues, again, that we lack the right sort of evidence for the evolution of human cognition.

Finally, Richardson considers the "comparative method", where we use what is known about phylogeny to determine which traits were present in ancestral groups. Again, the moral is pessimistic for evolutionary psychology: the fossil record doesn't offer the sort of evidence required. Too little is known about the details of hominid evolution, and the sorts of traits evolutionary psychologists are interested in -- namely, psychological ones -- leave little trace in the fossil record.

Throughout the book, Richardson goes to a lot of effort to show that he is not demanding too high a standard of evidence, that he is not asking for something so strict that most evolutionary biology would fail to meet it. Thus much of the book is spent going through specific biological examples and showing how, in each of the three types of evidence, they work.

I am no biologist, and so am ill-equipped to say whether Richardson fairly represents the sorts of standards to which evolutionary biologists are generally held. What is striking about the book's copious biological discussions is that they are mostly not drawn from evolutionary psychology itself. Indeed, for a book about the failings of evolutionary psychology there is very little direct discussion of evolutionary psychology. Buller's book, by contrast, is much more ready to get down in the trenches and fight it out with evolutionary psychology on specific hypotheses. (On the other hand, Buller's book is much longer than Richardson's -- there's no such thing as a free lunch.)

This does make it a little hard for the nonspecialist reader to tell whether Richardson is being entirely fair to evolutionary psychology. Even if we grant that it lays out the appropriate standards for evolutionary biology, the book doesn't convincingly show, through chapter and verse, that all or even most evolutionary psychology fails to meet those standards. The discussion of specific research within evolutionary psychology is very thin, so it's hard to tell whether it meets the right standards.

Worse, where there is discussion of specific work within evolutionary psychology, it's a little off, at least in one case in particular. At various points in the book, Richardson attributes to Leda Cosmides and John Tooby -- probably the two most influential evolutionary psychologists -- the view that "human reasoning consists of a set of mechanisms organized around social exchange" and that the "evolutionary function of human reasoning [is] to facilitate and monitor social exchange" (pp91-92, but see also e.g. pp20, 142).

As far as I can tell, this is either a pretty drastic misrepresentation or a pretty drastic misunderstanding of the view of Cosmides and Tooby. Either way, it's pretty drastic. Cosmides and Tooby are fans of the view sometimes called massive modularity -- the view, as they explain in a passage Richardson himself cites, that "the mind should contain organized systems of inference that are specialized for solving various families of problem, such as social exchange, threat, coalitional relations and mate choice" (the quotation is from Cosmides and Tooby 1992: 166). On their view social exchange is only one of the things for which human reasoning was selected. There's a whole bunch of other things that human reasoning does: it chooses mates and establishes coalitional relations, as they say, but also navigates the physical environment, makes basic judgements of numerosity, does folkpsychology and many other things besides. Thus there's no one thing for which human reasoning was selected; indeed Cosmides and Tooby might even prefer to say that there's no such thing as human reasoning at all. Rather, there's just a bunch of specialized reasoning modules, each selected for solving a different "adaptive problem" in our ancestral environment.

Although this is a serious misinterpretation of Cosmides and Tooby -- and one belied by the very passage Richardson himself cites -- none of this substantially affects any of the points made in the book. Nothing really hangs on Richardson's misinterpretation of Cosmides and Tooby. Still, it does make the reader wonder: if Richardson is wrong about Cosmides and Tooby here, might he not be wrong about evolutionary psychology more generally?


Brandon, R. N. (1990). Adaptation and Environment. Princeton, NJ, Princeton University Press.

Buller, D. J. (2005). Adapting Minds: Evolutionary Psychology and the Persistent Quest for Human Nature. Cambridge, Mass., MIT Press.

Cosmides, L. and J. Tooby (1992). "Cognitive Adaptations for Social Exchange". The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and the Generation of Culture. J. H. Barkow, L. Cosmides and J. Tooby. Oxford, Oxford University Press: 163-228.

Fodor, J. (2008). "Against Darwinism." Mind and Language 23(1): 1-24.

Gould, S. J. and R. Lewontin (1979). "The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm." Proceedings of the Royal Society of London B 205: 581-98.

Kitcher, P. (1985). Vaulting Ambition: Sociobiology and the Quest for Human Nature. Cambridge, Mass., MIT Press.