Evolutionary Religion

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J. L. Schellenberg, Evolutionary Religion, Oxford University Press, 2013, 174pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673766.

Reviewed by Keith Ward, Heythrop College (London)/Christ Church (Oxford)


The acceptance of deep time -- of the fact that the universe has existed for billions of years and that it will continue to exist for billions of years -- could, if inwardly digested, have a radical effect on human religious beliefs. In the first two chapters of this book, Schellenberg presents the scientific arguments for this view, and argues that the far-future beliefs of whatever succeeds the human species are liable to reduce our own early and primitive beliefs to virtual irrelevance. This is true in science, and we should expect it to be true of religion, too.

In the next two chapters he presents a sceptical argument based on this observation. If any present belief, he claims, is precise, detailed, profound, attractive, ambitious and controversial, then its denial is epistemically possible. And if that is so, then, given our primitive state, we are unreasonable in believing it. This argument is clearly and persuasively set out, but I am not persuaded. The belief, in physics, that there are no 'hidden variables' fully determining what happens at a sub-atomic level fulfils all these criteria, at least for many physicists. It is quite possible, as Einstein hoped, that a proof that there are hidden variables might emerge, even if it takes a million years. Who can tell what might happen in a million years? But does that mean that we should not now believe in quantum indeterminacy?

Well, it means that all such beliefs are provisional and liable to error, as well as being actually contested. We should not present them as absolutely unrevisable or inerrant or obvious. But we could surely think that it is reasonable to believe them, given the present state of our evidence. It would not seem right to say: 'Just postulate indeterminacy if you like; even act as though it were true; but don't believe it'. We take a risk in believing something that could be false. The evidence does not have to be conclusive, or universally compelling. But if, in a million years, evidence turned up that proved determinism, those future beings should not say, 'I am voluntarily going to postulate determinism now'. I think they should say: 'The evidence has become very strong that determinism is true. I feel compelled to accept it'. But on the evolutionary argument for scepticism, they should not believe it. There would still be millions of years ahead of those future beings, and the same arguments would apply -- who knows what future evidence would change their view of things? Deep time makes scepticism total and inescapable.

The argument from a deep unknown future, if used to justify epistemic scepticism, proves too much. The present belief that the universe is not run by unseen spirit powers, usually accepted by scientists but quite widely disbelieved nonetheless, is a belief whose denial is epistemically possible. So we should not believe it. (In fact, Schellenberg has a belief rather like this himself, namely that there is a transcendent, non-material and supremely valuable, ultimate reality. His argument entails that we should certainly not believe that.) But of course we should not believe its contrary either. It seems that the number of things we should believe is going to be very small.

In religion it is going to be minute. Considering how much religious beliefs have changed in a few thousand years, it seems likely that they will change out of all recognition in millions or billions of years. It is almost certain that present religious beliefs are grossly inadequate. Again, the threat of a future huge revision of beliefs, even though we can have no idea of what this revision will be, is used to undermine present beliefs. This argument has teeth, since many religious views do claim to propound unrevisable and final truths about the universe, based on past definitive revelation. And the Abrahamic religions have not usually taken to heart a belief that intelligent life will continue to exist, perhaps for billions of years.

Indian religious traditions have usually thought of deep time (indeed, an infinitely extended time), but they still tend to propound unrevisable truths and assume that knowledge will not change radically in future. And here is a problem for Schellenberg's view. If we do not know the future, how do we know that knowledge will improve and change considerably? There has been a remarkable revolution in knowledge in the last few centuries, but maybe that's it! What should we believe about the future? We simply have to extrapolate from the evidence available to us; but on Schellenberg's principles, since our evidence is so limited, we should have no positive beliefs about the future. The reasonable course is to believe what the evidence now available to us suggests, while accepting that it could be wrong and that it is likely to be inadequate in many ways. This might leave religions pretty much as they are, except that some of them would be a lot more cautious in their claims, and much more open to revisions of precise, detailed, and attractive (wish-fulfilling) propositions. Those are important recommendations, but could they justify giving up all religious beliefs?

Schellenberg takes up this challenge in his third pair of chapters, in which he recommends a new epistemic possibility, faith without belief, or 'imaginative faith'. He draws on proposals canvassed by Jonathan Cohen, William Alston, and Robert Audi, that 'acceptance' is different from 'belief'. The discussion is well worthwhile, and it is a trenchant response to the strictly evidentialist thesis that all reasonable beliefs must be proportioned to available evidence (except that 'beliefs' are going to be replaced by a different epistemic attitude, 'acceptance' or 'non-believing faith').

It is essential to Schellenberg's argument that 'belief' must be an involuntary feeling that some proposition is true. But 'acceptance' is a voluntary decision to picture something as true (though you do not believe it is), and act as if it were true. There are some conditions for such acceptance. The propositions must be possible (though given the deep time argument, almost any consistent proposition will be possible!). They must be viewed as good or morally attractive. This is odd, because 'attractiveness' is cited as one of the criteria for making a proposition less likely to be true (p. 50), so it is not just that you should not believe it; you should tend to disbelieve it. Also, what is thought to be attractive will be hotly disputed (by philosophical naturalists, for example), and will therefore also be 'controversial' and 'ambitious', which virtually rules belief out. Moreover, Schellenberg writes that there are degrees of feeling that a proposition is true, so that, for instance, the more attractive a proposition is, the greater reason you have for not feeling that it is true. Therefore a maximally attractive proposition is one for which you have the maximal reason for not thinking it is true. It is not just that you cannot decide. You really should feel strongly that it is not true. This seems rather worse than just not being able to decide on truth. It is accepting something and living your life in terms of something that there is good reason to think is untrue.

A major problem with this doctrine is that decisions to accept (but not believe) something come to seem both limitless and arbitrary. I believe it is not true that there are fairies. But it is possible there are, and I like fairies, so I can postulate that there are fairies. This is 'faith without belief', a very imaginative decision of mine. But is it reasonable? It seems irrational to say, 'I do not believe in fairies, but I act as-if there were fairies'. It seems equally irrational to say, 'I do not believe in God, but I act as-if there were a God'.

There is in some sense a voluntariness about faith that there is not about many common-sense beliefs. Imagination and commitment of the will are involved in forming and accepting many religious beliefs. But there must be reasons for acting as-if, and Schellenberg actually mentions some of them. Religious propositions, to be acceptable, must provide a plausible and comprehensive world view. There must be claimed 'experiences of an ultimate reality of ultimate value', which give some evidence of 'explicit interaction with transcendent Divine reality' (p. 78). Acceptance of religious propositions should increase 'maturity and insight' (p. 83). And there may be a feeling that one's present way of life is unsatisfactory and ignoble, and the lives of some religious believers (or 'accepters') might suggest more fulfilling possibilities. Such considerations might reasonably lead some people voluntarily to decide to adopt a religious belief, with its associated practices, in a sort of exploratory way, and see what happens.

If this is so, however, it follows that such things as moral attractiveness, contribution to human well-being, the existence of 'ambitiousness' (difficulty of comprehension), and 'controversy', are not in some circumstances reasons for non-belief. On the contrary, they are partly definitive of what religious belief is (apophatic and essentially contested), and are partly evidence for reasonable religious commitment (some religious propositions are profound, life-transforming, evocative of transcendent experiences, and generative of maturity and insight).

In the fourth and final pair of chapters, Schellenberg sets out to answer objections to his final view, which he calls 'ultimism' rather than theism. Ultimism pictures 'the ultimate reality [as] ultimately valuable and the source of an ultimate good in which we can participate', which participation can probably only happen for many after death (p. 155). I have to say this sounds like theism to me, especially since he espouses Anselm's formula for the ultimate, 'that than which no greater can be conceived'. But it is not, he writes, a belief; it is a postulate, or an as-if imagined reality. Though 'strong' (in positing an ultimate, rather than just something rather valuable and a source of some good), it is very 'thin', positing only a 'deeper and greater and more radically but positively transformative' reality (p. 88), the nature of which is to be better known in the far future, not a personal God who has revealed some unchangeable truths in a rather unconvincing way in the past.

In my view, Schellenberg's emphasis on deep time and on an evolutionary perspective is important, and it does have implications for religious beliefs. 'The ultimate' is a postulate, and there is no doubt much still to be learned about it. The discussion of the epistemic possibility of faith is valuable, though it seems to revise present linguistic usage too violently to say that faith is not a form of belief at all. There is a helpful analysis of what it means to speak of an 'ultimate'. But if you have a very 'thin' form of ultimacy (i.e., you say as little about it as possible), it does seem odd to say that it is also 'strong' (that it is the greatest thing imaginable, which will finally meet our deepest needs). I suspect that anyone who postulates that there is a supremely valuable source of universal and ultimate good will expect to find some specific instances of human contact with, and transformation by, this good. A search for revelation will begin, and you might expect to find that while such instances do not disclose all the truths there are to be known about the ultimate, nevertheless they provide accurate information which is not seriously misleading about the nature and goals of human existence.

Thus I think what Schellenberg is really saying is that religious believers should be much less dogmatic, especially about very detailed and obscure and controversial beliefs. They should be much more open to new possibilities of relating to an ultimately valuable transcendent reality. And they should not insist on precise ancient formulations and rules, but should be ready to re-think what makes for human well-being and human maturity. All this is well said, and probably needs saying. The book is accessible to the general reader. It deals with issues of 'spirituality' and 'religion' that are of both general and scholarly interest. And it would make a good text for college discussions of the nature of religious faith.

My own internal discussion of the book leads me to think that the religious are still properly called 'believers', that they should not separate the religious quest from seeking true beliefs about what is the case, and that they may reasonably think that in their religious faith there are some truths they know (though perhaps fewer than they think) that future experience is highly unlikely to refute. One good thing about the book is that it will stimulate readers to make their own response.